The Evidence for the Top Quark: Objectivity and Bias in Collaborative Experimentation

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Kent W. Staley, The Evidence for the Top Quark: Objectivity and Bias in Collaborative Experimentation, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 360pp, $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521827108.

Reviewed by Peter Bokulich, Dibner Institute for the History of Science and Technology, Massachusetts Institute of Technology


When I first saw the newspaper headline announcing that the top quark had been "observed" at Fermilab, my thoughts immediately turned to debates over the theory-laden character of observation, and to the question of what sort of "observation" might have actually occurred in this case. A glance at the article revealed that this discovery was not, for example, a cloud-chamber track distinctive of the top quark; the observation claim was instead based on registering particles resulting from the decay of a top quark. Reading further, however, it became clear that they did not even find particles that uniquely signaled the presence of the top quark: the discovery claim was instead based on detecting decay products more frequently than would be expected if the top quark had not been among the sources of those products. I couldn't help musing that empiricists such as Bas van Fraassen would be unhappy with this being called an "observation."

Kent Staley now presents us with a very insightful and readable book that explains how the physicists at Fermilab went about searching for the top quark, and that analyzes how the results of these activities constitute evidence for (or even an observation of) the top quark. His work deepens our understanding of bias and objectivity in scientific research, and moves forward current debates over the nature of scientific evidence. Staley defends an error-statistical account of evidence, which he argues provides significant resources for understanding and coping with potential biases in the analysis of scientific data. His philosophical analysis is informed by several lessons extracted from his engaging historical account of the search for the top quark, an account that paints a nuanced picture of collaborative physics research in all its social, political, practical, and epistemic complexity.

Although there is considerable overlap between the two discussions, the book is primarily divided between a treatment of the history of the experimental search for the top quark (Chapters 2-5), and a philosophical analysis of questions of confirmation (Chapters 6 & 7) addressed in light of the foregoing historical discussion. Staley's historical account is clearly very well researched; he makes extensive use of the archives at Fermilab and interviews with the individuals involved. His description of the experimental details, with very few exceptions, presupposes no scientific background, and the average non-scientist should be able to follow the relevant points with little or no difficulty. The philosophical analysis is well informed and persuasive, and covers a healthy variety of topics without trivializing any of the debates discussed. Taking on both of these projects in a single book is a formidable task, but one that sits well with the growing recognition that history and philosophy of science are often best pursued hand-in-hand. Staley does an admirable job of integrating the two discussions, and the result is a thorough investigation into the history and epistemology of this episode of experimental science.

The Evidence for the Top Quark begins with a brief investigation into the genesis of the theoretical prediction of the top quark, which helps to establish the larger context of the episode under study. The focus of Chapter 1 is a 1973 paper by Kobayashi and Maskawa, which is cited by the Fermilab physicists as an important contribution to the standard model's prediction of the top quark. In part, this chapter serves as an introduction to some of the key concepts needed for understanding the experimental project discussed in the rest of the book, but it also raises important themes regarding citation practices, and the historical importance both of national boundaries in publication and readership practices, and of philosophical commitments (specifically dialectical materialism) on the development of theoretical physics in Japan in the 1950s to 1970s.

The heart of Staley's story, however, is the large collaboration of scientists at the Collider Detector at Fermilab (CDF): an impressive array of detectors situated at a collision point of a proton beam and antiproton beam at the well known lab outside of Chicago. His account of the detector and the activities of collaboration scientists is extremely lively and accessible. Chapter 2 describes the development of the detector and the construction of the collaboration of scientists and provides essential background information for understanding the key features of the experimental procedure. Chapter 3 investigates some of the pragmatic and social factors that influenced the final form of the experiment performed. Staley nicely describes how some proposed experimental methods were not accepted by the collaboration because the scientists working on them did not have enough social influence to have other researchers investigate their proposals. These political factors are only one part of the story, however, and Staley convincingly argues that there it is only in an extremely limited sense that such episodes constitute a social construction of the final result of the evidential claim.

The genesis and content of the two key papers of CDF collaboration, the "evidence paper" and the "observation paper," are treated in Chapters 4 and 5, respectively. Staley argues that the writing of a paper presenting the results of an experiment is itself an important, though often neglected, aspect of the scientific process -- particularly in the case of large collaborations such as that of CDF (which included almost four hundred scientists). The collaboration engaged in extensive and difficult debates over the form that the presentation of results should take (multiple papers dealing with different aspects of the experiment and results, or a single very large paper), which results were relevant and should be included (the reliability of various simulations and analyses), decisions over how to count experimental successes (should they count the number of top quarks apparently produced or the number of times their procedures recognized a top quark -- i.e., do they count events or tags?), and how their results should be characterized. The more optimistic members of the collaboration thought the evidence warranted titling the paper "Discovery of the Top Quark," while more skeptical members believed that it was inappropriate to publish a discovery claim, and instead pushed for the title "Search for the Top Quark." The actual title was a compromise: they chose the unusual characterization "Evidence for the Top Quark." After a second run of detecting collision events, and another series of negotiation and decision-making, the CDF collaboration announced it had "observed" the top quark.

In Chapter 6 Staley develops and defends an error-statistical account of evidence, and begins the work of establishing the objectivity of evidence on this account. Staley builds on an account of scientific models developed by Patrick Suppes, R. I. G. Hughes, and especially Deborah Mayo. Although a bit more might have been done in this section to make his arguments accessible to the uninitiated -- i.e., to situate his discussion more explicitly and clearly in the philosophical debates over theories of evidence that he is addressing -- he builds a very convincing case for his central claim, which is that error-statistical theory can provide a measure of evidential weight that is both locally comparative (e.g., it allows me to say that these data are stronger evidence for this claim than those data are) and classificatory (i.e., these data are, or are not, evidence for this hypothesis), and that this measure is objective in the sense that whether an experimental result is evidence for a hypothesis is independent of an experimenter's beliefs and desires.

In Chapter 7 Staley presents an account of the (or a) goal of experimental practice, which he labels "experimenter's success." This is the goal that a hypothesis not only pass a severe test, but also that the experimenter know that such a severe test was passed, and that she be able to demonstrate to the scientific community that such a severe test was passed. The central task of this chapter is to confront the issue of bias entering into the design of an experiment and into the analysis of the experimental results. Staley defends the intriguing claim that the reason that "tuning on the signal" (that is, adjusting one's cuts -- one's model of the experiment -- in light of the data produced in the experiment) is problematic in that such a procedure cannot be accurately modeled, and it is this feature that poses an obstacle to the desired "experimenter's success."

The Evidence for the Top Quark is an excellent example of the fruitfulness of combining solid research in the history and sociology of science with careful analysis of debates in the philosophy of science. While the history of the scientists' activities and judgments is interesting in its own right, when viewed in light of the philosophical debates over scientific objectivity and evidence, we can recognize the important epistemic challenges faced by these researchers. Likewise, while the epistemic debates addressed by Staley are important as abstract philosophical issues, we gain a much deeper understanding of both the stakes of the game and of the possible moves available to scientists when we see how an actual collaboration of scientists confronted these issues and resolved them to its own satisfaction.

Staley's book should be of interest to a wide variety of scholars and laypersons interested in science, science studies, and the philosophy of science. It provides an important contribution to debates over traditional topics in philosophy of science -- while viewing them not as esoteric questions of interest only to epistemologists, but as pragmatic issues addressed by scientists in the daily practice of their research. One comes away from the book with a much deeper understanding of how experiments in high-energy physics are performed, and how we should understand the ensuing claims to have "evidence" for -- or perhaps even to have "observed" -- a theoretical entity.