The Existentialism of Jean-Paul Sartre

Placeholder book cover

Jonathan Webber, The Existentialism of Jean-Paul Sartre, Routledge, 2009, 169pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 978041541189.

Reviewed by Thomas C. Anderson, Marquette University


On his first page Jonathan Webber informs his readers that his aim "is to present a single coherent picture of the central themes of Sartrean existentialism" (xi) presented in Being and Nothingness and published works immediately preceding and following it. He argues that Sartre's philosophy is an "elaboration of one basic idea," which is that an individual's character consists in the projects the person pursues. The author's thorough explication of Sartre's notion of character is highly original as is his use of that notion to make better sense of bad faith, good faith, sincerity and authenticity. Also, Webber's claim that a study of Sartre's notion of character can contribute significantly to contemporary discussions of ethics, especially virtue ethics, seems to this reviewer on the mark. The Existentialism of Jean-Paul Sartre, which confronts an impressive number of the major interpreters of Sartre, is an extremely valuable scholarly contribution to that study.

Early on, Webber defines character as a "set of stable dispositions [or character traits] to experience, think, and feel in certain kinds of ways" which generally incline, not determine, a person to behave in patterned ways. He argues that commentators who claim that Sartre denies anything like character have overlooked the significant changes in Sartre's views between Transcendence of the Ego and Being and Nothingness. While the former denies their reality, the latter describes qualities as "the ensemble of virtues, latent traits, potentialities which constitute our character and our habits" and as "innate or acquired dispositions" (25, my emphasis) which explain our patterns of behavior. Ultimately, for Sartre, qualities or character traits, "consist in the overall set of projects that each person freely chooses to pursue and has the power to change" (29).

Next the author reviews Sartre's explanation of how each person's pursuit of projects organizes and constitutes in part the meanings that are present in his or her world. Most original is his discussion of Sartre's view of emotions as magical responses to the world which nevertheless are free since they result from one's freely chosen projects. He uses his/Sartre's notion of character to explain Sartre's enigmatic statement that man is "a being which is what it is not and which is not what it is" arguing that Sartre means that character traits are real but neither fixed nor deterministic and that we are not identical to the set of projects or character traits we have chosen since they are freely revisable. Projects can be hierarchically related as means and ends, projects we are aware of can be rooted in ones we are not reflectively aware of, and at the root of them all, Sartre believes, is a fundamental project which is not a specification of some deeper project and which colors all our secondary projects.

Chapter 5 argues that Sartre's insistence on the radical freedom of the fundamental project is not required by his theory of character and makes the incredible claim that rejecting it "would seem to leave Sartre's existentialism largely untouched" (72). Webber interprets Sartre's radical freedom to mean that a change in one's fundamental project is ultimately unmotivated and, therefore, indeterminate, unexplainable, and occurs purely by chance. Like Hume, whom he cites frequently, the author sees no alternative between determinism and indeterminism and so classifies Sartre as an "adamant" indeterminist (66)! As I read him, Sartre is rather an adamant proponent of free choice. One's choice is underdetermined in that it is not necessitated by external forces or by one's particular combination of motives or projects. After all, there can be many ways or means to achieve the same end. Yet that choice is not indeterminate or by chance but intelligible because it is explainable by at least some of those motives and projects. Webber apparently believes that if choice is not determined it is indeterminate, unexplainable, unintelligible, and occurs by chance. And he equates an explanation of a choice in terms of motives and projects with determination of that choice by those motives and projects. Furthermore, Sartre's fundamental project is not unmotivated for, as Webber recognizes later, the failure of one fundamental project can motivate the choice of another.

The next two chapters, 6 and 7, consist of a detailed treatment of Sartrean bad faith using his/Sartre's notion of character to great advantage. Webber does a better job of clarifying Sartre's ambiguous statements about the many varieties of bad faith (and good faith and sincerity) than anyone I have read -- and he includes a very helpful chart of these varieties (96). The term bad faith can mean: (1) a particular epistemic attitude toward evidence, (2) self-deception, (3) belief in fixed natures, (4) belief that one's own fixed nature does not include traits that one does possess. However, Webber rejects a kind of bad faith which most commentators find in Sartre; namely, a bad faith in which one identifies oneself with his/her freedom or transcendence thus denying that one has any kind of fixed nature or facticity at all.

Even though he continues to reject Sartre's notion of radical freedom, the author maintains that we can in principle alter our characters and qualities, albeit only on the basis of some motivation. Yet he also claims that motivation to change our character "itself expresses some part of our character" (87). This is perplexing since Webber defines character as dispositions and projects which explain the patterns of our experience and behavior. How then can a motivation to change one's patterned experiences and behavior express some part of the character one wishes to change? Finally, Webber's discussion of the faith of bad faith is very helpful in understanding how one can pursue the project of bad faith with only a nonreflective, non-thematic awareness of it. It also explains how bad faith itself provides strong motivation against becoming reflectively aware that one is engaged in that project.

In Chapter 8 Webber addresses Sartre's claim that "the fundamental project of human reality is the desire to be God" which he interprets as meaning humans want to possess the solidity of a fixed nature while also being conscious, a combination that is self-contradictory. While he recognizes that Sartre identifies consciousness with freedom, the author does not think that the desire to be God includes a desire to be free. Thus he overlooks another important dimension of Sartre's notion of God, namely God as an ens causa sui, a conscious and, therefore, free being which is the total cause of its being. Nevertheless Webber puts his finger on the problem with Sartre's assertion that the human desire to be God is a necessary part of human ontology, pointing out that such a position is incompatible with Sartre's earlier admission that human beings can radically escape bad faith. The author correctly resolves that incompatibility by suggesting that Sartre is actually claiming that it is only those people who are in bad faith who have the fundamental project to be God (109) and that people have the freedom to reject that project. He supports his suggestion by reviewing the many indications in Sartre, especially at the end of Being and Nothingness, that humans can deny their desire/project to be the impossible God and, therefore, abandon the world view of bad faith. In its stead Sartre prefers an authentic acceptance and affirmation of the way we are -- although why authenticity is preferable to bad faith has yet to be determined.

Before directly addressing that question, Webber turns in Chapter 9 to discuss the view of human relations Sartre presents in Being and Nothingness, namely that "conflict is the essence of human relations." Again, the author maintains that in Being and Nothingness Sartre is discussing human relations distorted by bad faith. Accordingly, since the project of bad faith can be rejected by a radical conversion to authenticity, human relations need not always be in conflict. I agree completely with Webber's interpretation.

But I have reservations about his explanation of Sartre's reasons for considering objectification by others to be alienation and degradation. I noted above that Webber does not recognize that for Sartre the desire to be God is a desire to be a being who would be conscious/free and the total cause of its own being. It is because of this that I experience my objectification by another to be my alienation and degradation since as an object of another free subject, I am dependent on that other's freedom. Even that other chooses to evaluate me favorably, the meaning given to my object side is out of my control and so thwarts my desire to be free and the total cause of my own being. Furthermore, contra Webber, Sartre believes that for another to view me as an object is to see me as a thing-like entity, not as a free subject. "Objectification is a radical metamorphosis" Sartre writes. Nevertheless, to repeat, I do agree with the author's fundamental thesis in this chapter, that a radical conversion to authenticity will remove the inevitability of conflict among human beings.

Still, even if it is possible for humans to reject bad faith and its project to be God, since Sartre believes that all values are creations of human freedom, how can he argue that we should embrace authenticity rather than bad faith? Granted that he defines authenticity as recognizing the truth about human existence and its freedom, still why value truth? Likewise, in Existentialism Is A Humanism Sartre claims that it would be "inconsistent" to value anything while denying value to freedom, since freedom is the source of all values. Even if this is so, Webber points out, consistency itself need not be valued.

His own suggestion for preferring authenticity is one that I have not found in the literature on Sartre. The author argues that an objective reason for preferring authenticity can be found "by showing that bad faith necessarily conflicts with our values in at least one area of life" (135). Those other values then "would provide both justification … and motivation for abandoning bad faith" (136). To demonstrate this, Webber goes in some detail through each of the concrete human relations Sartre discusses in Being and Nothingness and argues persuasively that within the project of bad faith all these relations with others will fail because they will always value and attempt to attain goals that cannot be achieved. (And, though he does not say so, the ultimate goal will be to be the impossible God.) This failure, he points out, can provide the motivation for a person to reject a bad faith project. I believe Webber is correct here but, as far as I can see, the argument from failure still does not show why one should choose authenticity in place of bad faith. After all there are any number of attainable goals that humans might choose for their fundamental projects, pleasure for example. Webber also recognizes that Sartre states that the authentic person should value both his own freedom and that of others and that he appeals to the interdependency of human freedoms as the reason for this. However, Sartre's comments are so brief that the author does not seriously attempt to construct an argument out of them. (Webber could have profitably consulted works of American authors -- such as David Detmer, Freedom As A Value, Thomas Flynn, Sartre and Marxist Existentialism and myself, Sartre's Two Ethics -- who have expounded Sartre's arguments on this issue in detail and depth.)

Since he believes that Sartre's championing of authenticity is rooted in his theory of character and that locates him in the tradition of virtue ethics, Webber returns in his final chapter to his/Sartre's notion of character. He argues that it is superior to the widely accepted Aristotelian conception of character as a set of habits. Although there are many fundamental similarities between the latter conception and Sartre's, Webber maintains that the relation between ownership and character can only be handled successfully by the latter, "in the face of a certain sort of objection" (149).

I am not sure I have grasped Webber's subtle arguments but this much is clear: he attempts to answer the question of ownership by asking what is it that makes a habit (Aristotle) or project (Sartre) one's own. And he focuses on the case where that habit or project (or desire) is "implanted" from outside. For Aristotle, such implantations would still be our own if they could be integrated into our rationally guided habits and so into the characters we have developed. But, Webber argues, that does not allow us to distinguish between habits actually owned by an individual and those implanted by alien forces (155). On the other hand, since Sartre conceives character as teleological states such as projects, if a project is implanted from outside, we could say that that project is not one we genuinely own because it would not be motivated by the set of projects (character) we pursue and can freely control. Yet, in spite of this difference between them, Webber states that in the final analysis some combination of the Aristotelian and Sartrean notions of character may be best.

The Existentialism of Jean-Paul Sartre concludes with the interesting suggestion that at bottom both Aristotle and Sartre propose a form of "eudaimonistic" ethics since both propose as their goal human well-being and flourishing. For Aristotle that means excelling in the rational capacities that define a human being, for Sartre it means recognizing and promoting freedom. However, if the latter's stress on authenticity can be understood as the acceptance of our true nature, then authenticity would involve promoting not just human freedom but all aspects of human existence and the human condition. The author correctly notes that Sartre's ethical thought did in fact develop in that direction. (Let me add that in his later "second" ethics, Sartre does indeed propose integral humanity, humans with needs fulfilled, as the goal of his morality.)