The Expansion of Autonomy: Hegel's Pluralistic Philosophy of Action

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Christopher Yeomans, The Expansion of Autonomy: Hegel's Pluralistic Philosophy of Action, Oxford University Press, 2015, 228pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199394548.

Reviewed by Franz Knappik, Humboldt University, Berlin


One of the philosophical projects that Hegel is most famous for is his critical development of Kant's theory of freedom as autonomy into an account on which the full realization of freedom requires the shared, institutionalized "ethical life" of modern states. While this part of Hegel's philosophy has always attracted considerable scholarly attention, relatively little has been written so far about how, on Hegel's account, determinate social institutions exactly shape and guide the agency of their individual members and thus enable them to realize freedom. Christopher Yeomans sets out to investigate this question by focusing on Hegel's theory of the estates, i.e. of the professional groups (farmers, craftsmen, merchants etc.) that constitute, for Hegel, the social stratification of modern ethical life. Yeomans analyzes such estates as incorporating different ways in which individual autonomy can be concretely realized. In its turn, this analysis is based on a detailed reconstruction of Hegel's moral psychology and theory of action, which identifies different structural elements of autonomous agency. Concrete forms of life within the estates are then understood by Yeomans as different projects for realizing autonomy, projects in which those elements are combined and traded off against each other in various ways. As a result, his book accounts for the psychological and normative fine-structure of Hegel's conception of modern ethical life and thereby fills an important gap in the literature.

More specifically, Yeomans reads Hegel's account of autonomous life in the estates as the result of a four-stage development in which Kant's universalist theory of autonomy is "expanded" into the sphere of the particular. The first step of this expansion consists in a distinction between three fundamental aspects of autonomy, which Yeomans introduces by discussing Hegel's critique of Kant and Fichte in the Reason chapter of the Phenomenology of Spirit (chapters 1-3). In order to realize Hegelian autonomy, we need to increase, on Yeomans' reading, (1) the degree to which we can regard ourselves, our actions, and the historical, social and normative conditions under which we act as our own ("self-appropriation"); (2) the degree to which the norms and purposes according to which we act have a determinate content ("specification of content"); and (3) the degree to which we have control over what we bring about in our actions ("effectiveness").

Second, Yeomans ascribes to Hegel a view of free agency on which talents and interests are assigned crucial psychological and normative functions. Talents and interests are seen, on this view, as the central explanatory factors of rational actions (80), and the presence of appropriate talents and interests is claimed to be necessary for free agency (206f.). In addition, he also thinks that for Hegel, talents and interests are a source of normative value as the promotion and development of one's talents and interests is an end in itself (167f.). (I shall say a bit more about what exact claims Yeomans ascribes to Hegel in that regard below, when I will discuss this part of his reading in some detail.)

The third step of Hegel's expansion of autonomy consists in a distinction between three different forms of agency or accountability. The first of these forms is one in which an initial immersion into given conditions for agency (e.g., traditions) is replaced by an appeal to intersubjective negotiation about the character of an action (section 5.1). The second form adds to this a dimension of conscious teleological planning (section 6.1), and the third form comes with an explicit knowledge on the part of the agent of how his or her actions are individualized forms of a universal good (section 7.1).

In its fourth and final step, Hegel's expansion of autonomy interprets the actual order of estates in early nineteenth-century Europe in terms of the previously developed structural elements. Each of the estates, on this reading, stands for a particular way in which the desiderata of self-appropriation, specification of content and effectiveness can be pursued in both the dimension of talents and that of interests. The estates of farmers (section 5.2) and soldiers (section 5.3) do so within the framework of the first form of accountability; the estates of craftsmen (section 6.2) and scholars (section 6.3) within the framework of the second form of accountability; and the public estate (doctors, jurists, teachers etc.) (section 7.2) as well as the estate of merchants (section 7.3) within the framework of the third form of accountability. Thus, for instance, farmers are quite successful at self-appropriation and specification of content as their lives are rooted in, and guided by, traditions that they experience as their own (118). However, the effectiveness of their agency is rather limited since it is to a large extent dependent on weather conditions (120). By contrast, artisanal and industrial production has a much firmer grip on the outcome of its action, so the estate of craftsmen succeeds better than that of farmers in promoting effectiveness (149f.). Yet the more transparent form of accountability that characterizes craftsmanship also leads to a greater awareness of the demands and needs of others, and this limits self-appropriation (153).

As Yeomans argues, there is no optimal solution to the trade-off between the desiderata of self-appropriation, specification of content and effectiveness. The autonomy that is realized in those projects is always limited in some way or another (126). At the same time, which particular project of autonomy one pursues or which estate one belongs to is up to oneself: we are free (within the constraints provided by our talents) to choose the estate that best corresponds to our interests (160). As a consequence, Hegel holds, on Yeomans' reading, a pluralistic theory of autonomous agency, according to which individuals have to decide among an irreducible variety of different ways in which they can actually realize autonomy. Finally, this pluralism also has a normative dimension, as moral duties, on Yeomans' reading, are specified in different ways depending on what estate an agent belongs to. He bases this part of his reading on remarks that Hegel makes about the duty of beneficence: in the case of farmers, this duty takes the form of an obligation to offer hospitality to those who are in need (197f.), whereas for craftsmen and industrial producers, it commands the institutionalized assistance to others within the framework provided by corporations (201f.).

Yeomans's enterprise is a fascinating one. His discussion of Hegel's views on the estates (which makes extended use of students' transcripts of Hegel's lectures on the philosophy of right) adds much-needed concrete detail to the debate on Hegel's theory of free agency, and the pluralist character of the theory Yeomans ascribes to Hegel is both intriguing and well-motivated. In addition, his account of how Hegel develops insights, and reacts to problems, from the writings of Kant (in particular, the Metaphysics of Morals) and Fichte contains many original ideas and observations. However, I fail to be convinced by Yeomans' reconstruction of the theoretical framework underlying Hegel's theory of the estates, that is, by the four-part expansion of autonomy that he ascribes to Hegel. Partly, this is because Yeomans often presents his argument in a highly condensed form and introduces key problems, concepts, and exegetical assumptions without the requisite commentary. I found it particularly hard to see how the key aspects of autonomy (self-appropriation, specification of content and effectiveness) and the three forms of accountability are precisely to be understood and how exactly these parts of Yeomans' interpretation are supported by the passages he refers to. The only passage that is cited as direct evidence for the distinction between the three aspects of autonomy is §109 of the Elements of the Philosophy of Right (100). Unless one already presupposes Yeomans' interpretive framework, this paragraph is more naturally read as distinguishing three almost trivial elements that every successful intentional action displays -- namely, the choice of an end, the realization of the end, and an identity of content between the merely intended and the executed end. Regarding the three forms of accountability, Yeomans refers to Hegel's threefold distinction between various restrictions of responsibility in the Morality chapter of the Elements of the Philosophy of Right (EPhR). But it is quite unclear how one gets from that distinction -- according to which we are not liable for unforeseen consequences of our actions (EPhR §117), for unintended consequences of our actions (EPhR §120), and for infringements of moral or legal norms that are beyond our insight or knowledge (EPhR §132) -- to Yeomans' three forms of accountability.

However, I think that Yeomans' interpretation encounters its greatest difficulties when it comes to the most original part of his reading: his reconstruction of a talent- and interest-based theory of free action that constitutes, as we have seen, the second part of his reading of Hegel's expansion of autonomy. According to this view, the agent "identifies as reasons those motivations that are grounded in his or her talents and support actions that are likely to develop those talents in ways suggested by his or her interests" (80). As becomes clear later, this is meant not only as a descriptive claim but also as a claim about what reasons are good reasons for actions: on Yeomans' reading, Hegel holds that "we have a duty to be interested in the activities for which we are talented . . . and to self-consciously direct our effective activity toward the exercise of those talents and more specifically toward exercises that promote their development" (167f.). Estates and professions, Yeomans thinks, assist us in this development of talents: once we have chosen membership in such a group on the basis of our interests and talents, that group provides us with standards for how precisely we should further develop our talents (160). Moreover, when we live up to the demands that our interests and talents make on us, our actions are free, they have their origin within us; otherwise, we act heteronomously. For instance, when we try to do something for which we do not have a talent, it is not really us who act; rather, the external circumstances are effective in such cases (206f.).

While it is uncontroversial that interests play a central role in Hegel's moral psychology, Yeomans' claims about the psychological and normative importance of talents in Hegel's theory are highly unusual. At the same time, these claims are fundamental for his understanding of Hegelian autonomy: they introduce a level of concreteness which goes beyond the shared norms of professional groups and adds particular normative demands for every individual as such. (As Yeomans claims, Hegel sees talents as "the individualized mode in which the substantial good of historical, social reason is immanent within us" (167).) However, I think that this part of his reading gives rise to considerable exegetical and philosophical difficulties. To begin with, the textual evidence in favor of Yeomans' reading is very slim. Nowhere in the Elements of the Philosophy of Right or in the Encyclopedia does Hegel explicitly ascribe to talents any function in his theory of free agency. (Instead, within the Encyclopedia (Enc.) Philosophy of Spirit, he locates talents within Anthropology -- the theory of "soul or natural spirit" (Enc. §387), that is, the lowest dimension of subjective spirit -- and treats them as mere parts of the "individualized natural determination" of a subject, on a par with its temperament, physiognomy and "further dispositions and idiosyncrasies of families or the singular individuals" (Enc. §395, 10:70).[1]) That Hegel's theory of freedom in the Elements of the Philosophy of Right should nevertheless be read in terms of a moral psychology for which talents are central follows for Yeomans from the role that talents play in the sections "Virtue and the way of the world" and "The spiritual animal kingdom" in the Phenomenology of Spirit (PhS). In particular, Yeomans refers here

(a) to Hegel's statement in "Virtue and the way of the world" that "all the things which engage individuality are ends in themselves, and the use of powers along with playing the game of giving them outward expression is what gives life to what otherwise would be the dead in-itself" (PhS 3:291[2]) (81); and

(b) to a passage in "The spiritual animal kingdom" (PhS 3:297f.) where Hegel analyzes action in terms of talents, interests and circumstances (70ff.).

However, there is strong reason to believe that in passages (a) and (b), Hegel does not actually voice his own position, but rather presents and discusses a position that he wishes to reject. The view stated in passage (a) -- the expression of an individual's character and talent in actions as an end in itself -- had emerged from the discussion of modern conceptions of virtue in "Virtue and the way of the world" and is critically examined in "The spiritual animal kingdom". Already at the beginning of the following section in the Phenomenology of Spirit, we learn that "The original-determinate nature of the individual" -- i.e., the individual's "particular ability, talent, character, etc." (PhS 3:296) -- "has lost its positive determination of being in itself the element and the purpose of its activity" (PhS 3:311). Hence, precisely the view in question seems to be rejected as a result of the discussion in "The spiritual animal kingdom". Similarly, Hegel in other writings repeatedly claims that individuals have value insofar as they participate in the universality of reason. For instance, in the Remark to §21 of the Elements of the Philosophy of Right, Hegel points out that self-consciousness is the "principle of right, morality and all ethical life" insofar as it comprehends itself and its contents in the mode of thinking, i.e. as something universal; indeed, if one would exclude thinking -- and thus, universality -- from right, morality and ethics, one would "deprive man of all truth, value and dignity" (7:72f.). Similarly, in the Philosophy of History (12:54, cited by Yeomans (112)), Hegel ascribes "infinite value" to an individual's religion and ethics because they are "in themselves universal essences". Such claims seem to imply that, rather than being valuable in their own right, our individual talents have value only insofar as they contribute to our realization of universal, intrinsically valuable purposes.

As a consequence, the talent- and interest-based analysis of action in passage (b) becomes unavailable, too, as evidence for Yeomans' reading. For Hegel introduces that analysis as a corollary to the view of self-expression as an end in itself -- more precisely, as a way in which this view can respond to an initial objection. It could seem, so this objection goes, that in order to decide how we best express our individuality in our actions, we need prior knowledge about our character, talents and interests; at the same time, we can gain such knowledge only on the basis of our actions (PhS 3:297). Passage (b) responds to this problem by claiming that within the given circumstances, the interest and the talent of the individual automatically entail a particular combination of end and means as the right course of action. But once the underlying view of self-expression as end in itself is abandoned, there is no motivation left to think that the way we ought to act is always settled in such a simple way. Hence, there is no good reason, either, to believe that the talent- and interest-based analysis of action in passage (b) voices Hegel's own view of action.

Finally, the view of talents that Yeomans attributes to Hegel is intrinsically problematic, too. On the one hand, he ascribes to Hegel the idea that free agency always involves the exercise of a talent and that a lack of talent undermines free agency. Such claims are only plausible if a very broad reading of "talent" is adopted, on which more or less any reliable capacity to perform an action can count as talent. This is confirmed by Yeomans' example of a "lack of coordination" that undermines my attempt to throw a rock into a pond (207). On the other hand, Yeomans ascribes further views to Hegel that clearly presuppose a much more restricted notion of talent. In particular, this holds for Yeomans' above-cited claims about the normative status of talents, according to which we a have a duty to develop our talents and to be interested in the activities we have a talent for. Since people have reliable capacities for all sorts of bad actions, those normative claims can only refer to a very restricted sub-class of capacities. It is quite unclear how the difference between the capacities that do count as valuable talents in this sense and those that don't can be accounted for if not in terms of their instrumental value (or lack thereof) for the pursuit of more fundamental goods (an account that is precluded by the idea that talents are valuable in themselves).It also follows that Yeomans relies in this context on a much more restricted notion of talent than he did before. So his account of the role that talents play for Hegel's theory of autonomy is also flawed by an ambiguity in the notion of talent: there is no univocal notion of talent that could support the various claims he ascribes to Hegel in this regard. Therefore, I think it is fair to conclude that despite the great interest it doubtless has, there is good reason to remain skeptical about Yeomans' account of the theoretical framework behind Hegel's theory of the estates.


Hegel, G.W.F. (1986) Werke, 20 vols., ed. Moldenhauer and Michel, (Frankfurt: Suhrkamp)

[1]In quoting from Hegel's writings, I use (unless indicated otherwise) my own translations, and give volume and page numbers according to Hegel (1986).

[2] Yeomans' translation (81). The original for "all the things which engage individuality", "das Tun und Treiben der Individualität", has a slightly negative connotation that would be better conveyed by "the hustle and bustle of individuality."