The Experience of Injustice: A Theory of Recognition

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Emmanuel Renault, The Experience of Injustice: A Theory of Recognition, Richard A. Lynch (tr.), Columbia University Press, 2019, 272pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231177061.

Reviewed by Gabriel Gottlieb, Xavier University


Emmanuel Renault’s book offers a critical theory of justice grounded in the concept of recognition. His model serves as an alternative to the liberal models of justice found in Rawls and Habermas. Originally published in French in 2004, this English translation (by Richard A. Lynch) of Renault’s book should be welcomed by political philosophers working on theories of justice, identity politics, social movements, the limits of liberalism, and critical theory more generally. For philosophers working on the politics of recognition, the book is essential reading.

Building on the Hegelian-inspired theory of recognition articulated by Axel Honneth in The Struggle of Recognition, Renault aims to reorient Honneth’s model of recognition around “the normative content of negative social experiences that can lead to an experience of injustice” (xviii). An “experience of injustice,” the normative concept at the center of Renault’s book, refers to “the experience of being subjected to injustice.” Experiences of injustice occur when the normative expectations of a subject (or group) are disappointed and when the disappointment results in an injustice one lives through and feels as unjust. The non-satisfaction of some set of normative expectations alters one’s practical orientation by causing reactions that may consist in rejecting unjust conditions, actively struggling for justice, or fleeing to circumstances that are perceived as satisfying the relevant normative expectations. Along with this practical re-orientation comes a shift in cognitive processes that, ideally, support one’s practical orientation; these cognitive processes may include reflection, greater attention to unjust circumstances, research and the development of plans to respond (13).

To see how Renault’s concept of an experience of injustice works, consider a woman from Honduras who is fleeing sexual violence perpetrated by gang members who operate with impunity. Her normative expectations include the expectation that individuals will respect her rights, bodily integrity, and personhood. She also rightly expects that her government will protect its people from such violence and prosecute valid claims. When individuals and institutions fail to meet these expectations, she experiences an injustice, since she lives through an unjust situation that is accompanied by a feeling of that situation as unjust. Researching how to seek asylum and traveling to the United States and applying for asylum status reflect a change in her cognitive and practical orientations that are responsive to the experience of injustice. Recognition of her experiences and identity by institutions and individuals in the United States contributes to the satisfaction of her normative expectations and the promotion of a positive practical self-relation.

Renault holds that recognition is the proper response to such experiences of injustice. But, what exactly is recognition? And, what is the nature of its relationship to the concept of justice? Renault’s answers largely rely on Honneth’s theory of recognition. Recognition consists in a cognitive identification of another’s value and a practical treatment of the other that expresses this value. The moral integrity of the self is constituted by intersubjective relations of recognition that express valuations of others, and thereby shapes the integrity of one’s practical relation to oneself by promoting positive or negative, non-pathological or pathological self-relations. Honneth identifies three forms of recognition: love (primary relationships), rights (legal relations), and solidarity (social relations). Each form of recognition has the power to shape one’s practical self-relation: self-confidence is shaped by love relations, self-respect by the recognition of rights, and self-esteem by social recognition. Renault accepts Honneth’s recognitive framework (with some minor tweaks here and there). What Renault aims to make more explicit than Honneth himself does, is that the “concept of justice presupposes the concept of recognition” (28). His suggestion is that there is an analytic connection between justice and recognition, which entails that all acts of injustice are acts of misrecognition or the denial of recognition. If justice requires the satisfaction of normative expectations, and justice and recognition are analytically connected, the satisfaction of normative expectations can be described as the satisfaction of relations of recognition (the positive constitution of a practical self-relation) (29).

Not all philosophers are satisfied with granting recognition such a prominent position in addressing issues of justice. Nancy Fraser has argued that the politics of recognition reifies identity and displaces struggles for redistribution.1 Kate Manne has recently argued that a politics of recognition oriented around the recognition of humanity is normatively deficient (to use Renault’s terms) since in the case of many injustices, including misogyny (her primary object of study), recognition of humanity is a precondition of the injustice.2 Renault’s concept of recognition is well suited to address these concerns since his theory is not formulated around a principle of humanity (or universalist principles), his conception of identity is non-essentialist and flexible, and, finally, redistributive struggles are not disconnected from struggles of recognition insofar as the just distribution of goods promotes positive self-relations.

Renault’s recognitive theory of justice approaches justice from experiences of injustice rather than from “explicitly formulated principles of justice” (36). He provides, thereby, a theoretical framework for a non-ideal recognitive theory of justice. What exactly is Renault’s main complaint against ideal theory? In the first chapter, “Social Movements and Critique of Politics,” he considers the views of Rawls and Habermas. Renault claims that their ideal theories fail to acknowledge the legitimate demands of subjects suffering injustice. An ideal theory of justice oriented around explicit principles of justice can narrow “the space of institutionalized politics” rendering “politically inexpressible” claims of injustice made by the subjects experiencing injustice since the claims do not fit within the discourse of justice delimited by the principles (33). Are there legitimate claims of injustice that fail to register as such on a Rawlsian paradigm? Renault clearly thinks so. He offers by way of example the injustices suffered by employees of a large corporation (or “neoliberal company”) (44). Such employees are not exactly the least advantaged when compared to the unemployed poor, the homeless, or undocumented immigrants. However, under what Elizabeth Anderson has termed the “private government” of the workplace, individuals may suffer injustices that pertain to performance evaluations, pay inequalities, the arbitrary exercise of power, alienation, and limits on one’s movement and agency in and outside the workplace (44).3 These forms of suffering tend to fall outside the purview of liberal models of justice. For Rawls, the issue is that his prioritizing of the least advantaged “excludes those who suffer anything other than residual injustices” (44). Insofar as the experiences register as experiences of injustice or forms of social suffering, they are visible within the framework of Renault’s expanded conception of justice.

Renault identifies three categories of experiences of injustice: 1) a feeling that the principles of justice have been violated; 2) a feeling that the principles are too restrictive or exclusive since they do not extend to all relevant subjects; or 3) a feeling that the principles are false because they are consistent with grave injustices, some of which cannot legitimately be expressed as injustices within the established normative framework (45). Renault claims that liberal theories of justice can account for the first experience of injustice, but not the other two. It is not difficult to imagine a Rawlsian objecting here. There are two ways in which a principle of basic rights and liberties may be too restrictive: first, it may be restrictively interpreted under non-ideal conditions; and second, it may be restrictively formulated or interpreted in the original position. Under non-ideal conditions, civil rights struggles would aim to instantiate the principle in a non-exclusive way so all relevant subjects have the rights guaranteed by the principle. An exclusive principle of rights (one that excludes based on race or gender) would, Rawls holds, not pass muster in the original position. Renault reasons that Rawls cannot handle the second category since “experiences of injustice call for processes of reciprocal adjustment between experience and principles of justification, between a process of politicizing experience and a process of transforming the principles of justice” (45-6). The disagreement, it seems to me, is that while Renault holds that experience may induce a transformation of the very principle, Rawls would insist that the transformation would be in the interpretation and application of the principle under non-ideal conditions. Renault, however, has a valid claim against Rawls’s limiting of justice to the basic structure. Regarding the vast literature on this topic, Renault’s contribution consists in framing this objection within the framework of his theory of recognition.

If liberal theories of justice have a way of addressing experiences of injustice in categories 1 and 2, Renault might be right that they have greater difficulty addressing experiences in category 3. For methodological reasons, this difficulty is related to how Rawls and Habermas understand the aims of political philosophy. A weak sense of political philosophy, Renault suggests, urges that the demands of individuals experiencing injustice are considered by political agents and theoreticians. A strong sense demands that political philosophy not only welcome the demands of the suffering but does so according to “the ways in which they articulate their demands” or in the “political language of political actors” (35). Following such a method involves “adopting a perspective from below”; and, according to Renault, doing so will force us to expand our definitions of justice to capture the varied nature of experiences of injustice (227). For Kantians such as Rawls and Habermas, practical reason provides the normative resources required of a theory of justice. According to Renault, “it is clear that the political demands of those who suffer injustice are not expressed in the language of the requirement of universality proper to practical reason” (36). One might object by arguing that what matters is that the normative content of the demand of those who are suffering can be captured by principles generated from the resources of practical reason, even if those principles are not “in the language” of the suffering. According to Renault, the political philosophies of Rawls and Habermas fail to meet the conditions of a strong sense of politics since “they do not recognize political demands as they are expressed by those who suffer injustice” (36).

Throughout the book, Renault argues that social movements are a vehicle for the social critique of established politics and the transformation of political systems, since their demands for justice are based on experiences of injustice rather than normative principles selected from an ideal standpoint (46). Renault identifies three types of social movements: 1) social struggles (class and redistributive struggles for equitable wealth), 2) identity struggles (struggles for equitable recognition of identities), and 3) struggles of the deprived [lutes de ‘sans’] (struggles that seek the stable and rewarding social integration of the unemployed, undocumented immigrants, and the homeless). Renault’s conception of social movements is somewhat restrictive:

a social movement strictly speaking . . . must be endowed with specific forms of organization and an internal public space (an auditorium, a general assembly, discussions around a fire pit) in which the work is done of reflection about normative expectations and values that animate the movement. (59)

He does not, somewhat surprisingly, address whether Twitter or social media (or the internet in general) offer the kind of resources needed to meet the organizational and public space conditions on social movements. If they don’t, then one might just say, so much for his conception of social movements, and offer a more expansive conception to take its place. Since the book was first published in 2004, one might forgive him for such an oversight (the internet and certainly social media were in their infancy); however, it is odd that by 2019 he did not add some analysis (even if brief) of the internet and social movements.

Chapter Three (“The Institutions of Injustice”) accounts for how institutions, such as the market or the firm, shape and disfigure one’s practical self-relation, a possibility that is conditioned by the fact that “different dimensions of our social existence are tied to institutions” and the “normative expectations that apply to different institutional spheres” (101). Employing a revised version of Robert Castel’s conception of disaffiliation, Renault explains how institutional structures such as the market and the firm can socially exclude subjects by failing to socially integrate them into social institutions (and, ideally, institutions that promote positive self-relations).

Chapters Four and Five deal with recognition and identity politics. Renault views identity not as a psychological or cultural property or as a socially constructed category that “doesn’t correspond to what” particular subjects “really are or the experiences they really have” (137). The problem with the former is that it tends toward essentialism, while the latter can fail to correspond to the subject’s social experience, and is, according to Renault, arbitrary. Renault views identity as “a category enlisted in specific social experiences and which thus has the function of resolving particular problems” (137). One’s identity consists in the “reflexive relation” maintained when situations arise that require a response to identity-oriented questions: “Who am I?”, “What am I worth?”, “Who are ‘we’?”, and “What makes us different from other groups?” (138). In other words, one’s identity becomes an issue when situations arise that force one to address or resolve these kind of identity questions. To return to case of the asylum seeker, as a subject living a relatively peaceful and fluid life in Honduras, aspects of her identity might be characterized as pre-reflective, but when a social situation emerges that forces identity questions upon her, then she must reflectively thematize her identity by addressing it as part of an answer to a problem. In doing so, she must articulate reasons that legitimate her identity. She might, for instance, determine that her bodily integrity is not being respected by individuals or the state; based on this determination her cognitive and practical orientations are re-oriented. She might resolve how she is different from the groups perpetuating violence or from the citizens in the country in which she seeks asylum. Renault’s conception of identity is not essentialist since identity is constituted in response to the resolution of problems emergent from contingent social situations; it is also not arbitrary since it is responsive to social experiences. Drawing on the existentialist thought of Simone de Beauvoir and Jean-Paul Sartre, Renault holds that one becomes who one, in a sense, “is”: “we become someone (or a group) who has this sort of problem to resolve” (139).

Chapter Five offers “A Defense of Identity Politics.” Renault identifies three objections to conceiving struggles for justice as struggles for the recognition of identity: 1) the liberal objection that identity is normatively deficient, 2) the Foucauldian objection that identity is the outcome of powers of subjection, and 3) the post-modern objection that the politics of difference is to be preferred over the politics of identity. I will only address the normative deficiency objection. Some liberals argue that group and individual liberties easily can be denied when the politics of identity-recognition is privileged over the politics of respect for universal rights and dignity (162). Liberals tend to advocate for a kind for neutrality with respect to cultural values and competing conceptions of the good. The liberal preference for universal rights and appeals to human dignity provide normative grounds presumed to be absent from the politics of identity.4 Renault responds by claiming that the denial of the recognition of identity causes social suffering and a disfiguring of one’s practical relation to oneself (164). This, he thinks, should offer ample normative grounds and, thereby, provide a reason to believe that the politics of identity is not normatively deficient. The normative ground of identity demands not the category of identity itself or respect of difference and diversity, but that of social suffering. Claims of social and psychic suffering demand a response.

Chapters Six and Seven elaborate on the categories of social and psychic suffering. Renault sees in contemporary political philosophy a paucity of reflection on social suffering and the precarious standing of the unemployed, homeless, and (to a lesser extent) the undocumented. Suffering is divided by Renault into psychic suffering, the subjective effects that social suffering has on an individual, and social suffering, a social process that increases “precariousness and social disaffiliation” (190-91). Renault draws on the writings of Pierre Bourdieu, who views suffering as a “set of subjective difficulties” the causes of which are often “barely perceptible” because they are “partial, relative and routinized” (186). For Renault, “the term ‘social suffering’ serves precisely to explain the principal characteristics of experiences of injustice that are difficult to express as such” (187). Perhaps due to this difficulty, the idea of social suffering remains somewhat vague.5 Renault is clear about who experiences such suffering. The struggles of the deprived are best described as a form of social and psychic suffering. The distortion of a positive practical self-relation is certainly a central aspect of this suffering (211). Feelings of malaise, alienation, conflict, disaffiliation, and social exclusion result from social suffering.

Renault holds that alternative models of justice (distributive, virtue-based, or utilitarian) cannot integrate the category of suffering into their definitions. Even if one is partial to recognitive theories of justice (as I am), this claim seems largely off the mark. Utilitarians can handle the concept of suffering in both quantitative and qualitative terms and liberals can address issues of suffering through a substantive interpretation of equality of opportunity.6 What matters is how each theory integrates the concept of suffering. What are the reasons the theory offers for viewing social suffering as an injustice? What are the mechanisms the theory appeals to in order to mollify or eliminate experiences of social suffering? For Rawlsians, suffering may diminish the primary good of self-respect or undermine fair equality of opportunity. For Renault, social suffering constitutes an injustice since it disfigures our practical self-relation and undermines a positive self-conception. Relations of mutual recognition serve to reshape the self by promoting self-realization. Since much of social suffering remains invisible to theoreticians and practitioners of justice, social critique that adopts the perspective from below by expressing the demands of justice of the suffering in their terms can give visibility to such experiences of injustice. As Renault explains, social transformations are often supported by what he calls a “spokesperson,” someone who as a stakeholder employs social critique as an instrument in political struggle to give expression or voice to the deprived or suffering for the purpose of social transformation (184, 224-226). Political philosophy, for him, does not aim at neutrality, but “takes sides,” the side of the downtrodden, the socially excluded, the alienated, the stigmatized, in a word, the suffering (224).

1 Fraser, Nancy. “Rethinking Recognition.” New Left Review 3 (2000): 107-120. See also her debate with Honneth in Nancy Fraser and Axel Honneth. Redistribution or Recognition?: A Political-Philosophical Exchange. New York: Verso, 2003.

2 Kate Manne, Down Girl: The Logic of Misogyny, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

3 Elizabeth Anderson, Private Government: How Employers Rule Our Lives (and Why We Don’t Talk about It), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2017.

4 Charles Taylor outlines and addresses these issues in “The Politics of Recognition” in Multiculturalism: Examining the Politics of Recognition (ed. Amy Gutmann), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1994.

5 Renault address the issue of social suffering more directly in Social Suffering: Sociology, Psychology, Politics, tr. Maude Dews, New York: Rowan and Littlefield, 2017.   

6 Tommie Shelby’s work on racial justice can be viewed under such a light. See “Race and Social Justice: Rawlsian Considerations,” Fordham Law Review (71): pp. 1697-1714 and Dark Ghettos: Injustice, Dissent, and Reform, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2016.