The Family: A Liberal Defence

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David Archard, The Family: A Liberal Defence, Palgrave Macmillan, 2010, 131pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230580596.

Reviewed by Tamara Metz, Reed College


Families generate and perpetuate inequality and threaten freedom. "Liberals, [therefore], who are committed to the ideal of a just society should worry about the existence of the family" (79).

In this crisp volume, drawing on almost two decades of work on the subject, David Archard offers a compelling "qualified" liberal defense of the family. A response to philosophical and practical challenges to the family, this work expands a tradition with roots in John Locke, John Stuart Mill, John Rawls and Susan Moller Okin and engages the range of contemporary English-language liberal political philosophical literature on the subject. For scholars interested in this tradition, liberal political philosophy, the family, and current policy debates the book could well serve as the standard elaboration of a popular, if somewhat narrow, perspective.

From outside the Anglo-American liberal philosophical tradition, Archard's approach may seem limited. He does not engage radical feminist, deconstructionist, or queer theorists. He pays inadequate attention to the influence of discourse. Some will say that his argument is deeply conservative: he starts with and does not question liberal values. And despite his commitment to "liberal neutrality," he operates from within a distinctly postmodern, liberal worldview. So, for instance, he dismisses the view that procreation is a means of escaping immortality as "rhetorical" (31). Of course, for those who believe otherwise, it isn't. But these criticisms come from outside the confines of liberal political philosophy. From within that tradition, and thus to the scholarship generally, Archard's defense is a compelling and valuable contribution.

Archard begins by defining "the family." Not a simple task. As he notes, many social scientists reject the possibility of a definition expansive enough to capture features common to radically diverse social forms that might be called "family." Archard resists this conclusion. He proposes that a functional definition can both capture the common essence of myriad social forms that share a family resemblance to "family" and avoid the dangers of "persuasive" definitions masquerading as neutral, descriptive definitions: "In the light of this essential functional role the family can be minimally defined as a multigenerational group, normally stably co-habiting, whose adults take primary custodial responsibility for the dependent children" (10).

Using function to define family allows us to assess a wide range of forms and, in good liberal practice, attend to actions not beliefs. This approach cuts through many contemporary disputes centered on form (e.g., families headed by opposite versus same sex parents). Further, as his survey of philosophical and social scientific literature indicates, care is widely seen as an essential activity of the family. Archard's definition will have wide and well-reasoned appeal among liberal philosophers and citizens.

And yet, Archard may oversell his definition. He suggests that it is merely descriptive. In some sense, yes. But it is neither neutral nor uncontroversial. And it need not be. To contribute to the political philosophical debate of whether the family is justified, Archard needs only to specify a plausible, clear definition with wide appeal. Some will contest his definition. But then only judgment, not analysis, will be relevant. Paradoxically, one casualty of Archard's aim of inclusiveness and neutrality is substantive analysis upon which good judgment depends. So, one might ask if the definition excludes too much. Why, for instance, must family involve care of children? Why not families of adults? Conversely, one might ask if the definition excludes too little. It seems that the only unpaid, child-care giving unit not included in his family of families is something like Plato's scheme in the Republic, or what Martha Nussbaum calls a "family state." To answer either of these sets of questions, a fuller discussion of the nature of human dependency and the value of intimate care would have been helpful. This is especially true since family privacy, and the intimacy it protects and fosters, are key to Archard's final, qualified defense of the institution.

Having defined family, Archard turns to what would be the strongest liberal stand in its defense: to conceive of family as a right. Do individuals possess a right to family? If they do, one consequence is that the critical potential of the definition would be moot: for a right is not weakened by its ill-use. (Think of the right to free speech: saying stupid things does not threaten one's right to speak.)

International law, including various UN charters, upholds "the right to marry and found a family" (Universal Declaration of Human Rights, quoted in Archard, 33). Archard, however, rejects the claim that adults possess a right to family. Parents have duties. (On this count, following a tradition as old as Locke, he argues that by bringing another human being into existence, parents incur an obligation to provide that person with adequate life chances.) But, against a fair share of popular and scholarly opinion, he argues that parents do not have rights to family. The family is justified not by rights, but -- to the extent that it is -- by the interests of children and the society of which they, ideally, become good members.

In support of this conclusion, Archard usefully disaggregates four claims that might be included in such a right: a) the right to found a family (i.e., to procreate), b) the right to act as a parent (i.e., to occupy a custodial role to a child), c) the right over a child (i.e., to exercise exclusive authority over a particular child), and d) the rights of parents (i.e., what one may do as a parent). Because each claim emphatically prioritizes parental interests over those of children -- human beings with their own moral standing -- he argues that they fail to withstand liberal scrutiny. On this basis he rejects all varieties of the propertarian view of parenthood. The notion that parents own their children and thus possess attendant rights over them conflicts with the liberal insistence that one human being cannot own another. The right to act as a parent is undermined by the same logic: the moral status of children precludes unmitigated priority of parental interest in any respect. The rights that parents do have, for instance to be left alone in their parenting choices, are strictly circumscribed by the prior duty to ensure that their children enjoy "minimally decent lives."

The welcome thrust of this argument is its challenge to strains of the liberal (and other) tradition that forget that children are human beings too. On one count, however, Archard's argument is unconvincing and even troubling. To say that individuals do not possess a right to found a family amounts to saying that the state has reason to prevent some individuals from procreating. Given the rest of his argument, it is hard to imagine how Archard arrives comfortably at this conclusion. Yet he appears to do so.

In chapter three, Archard elaborates his claim that parents have not rights over but duties to children and to society. On this basis alone do adults wield authority over particular children. If biology does not provide parents with rights over particular children, how then should children be "allocated"? Why, if at all, should we recognize a parent's claim to any particular child? His answer: biology provides "good reasons to adopt the rule that those who bear children should normally rear them" (60). Why? First, per the best interests of the child, bearing typically evinces "demonstrated commitment" by particular adults to particular children. Second, "kinship matters in most cultures" (61). Since most cultures treat biological connections as significant, people within those cultures will treat them as significant in their behavior toward their offspring. Thus, biology is a good presumptive -- though not decisive -- basis for distribution of parental status.

One worry about this otherwise perfectly sensible justification is that it is insufficiently critical. Privileging biology rests on observed correlation between biology and behavior. But, of course, as Archard notes, the connection may have much to do with culture. Assuming we can change culture, one wishes that he were more self-conscious of the reifying potential of his argument.

Having relegated biology to a presumptive signal, Archard returns in chapter four to the question of form. What forms can families take? Which forms do better? To the first question, he offers a somewhat unsatisfying answer: he defends "the ideal of family" against the "family state" exemplified in Plato's Republic. Notably, his argument -- about form -- has little to do with the proposed function of families and much to do with liberal political commitments to diversity and choice. Since it is unclear what other forms of child-rearing would be excluded from his definition of family, and Plato's option can be assessed with other forms, I am not sure what he achieves here except to gesture toward substantive reasons that intimate groups may do better than large, political associations at raising children. I wish he had done more than gesture. It is clear that he takes intimacy to be an essential feature of any social institutional form he wants to call family. One can imagine many good reasons why. And yet, perhaps because of his commitment to relying on only a functional defense of family, he abjures from making the case. Alas. In other instances as well a fuller discussion of the nature and value of intimate care would have strengthened his argument.

Archard's response to the second question is quite useful. A key virtue of the functional definition is that it allows us to assess different so-called "family" forms. Here he lays out an "account of how one might go about appraising different forms" (68). The short version: with facts. We should evaluate forms on the basis of empirical evidence of how well, if at all, they "raise dependent and vulnerable children to adult independence" (68). Archard notes that this is not as simple as it may seem. He thus offers important cautions, ranging from the observation that classifying families per form is not the best or most accurate way of assessing their child-rearing abilities (for example, the quality of the parents' relationship might matter a lot) to the reminder that facts can be slippery. "It is a familiar social scientific truth that statistical regularities can easily mislead" (70). He concludes the chapter with an equally sensible discussion of the impact of and subsequent caution with which we should proceed in crafting laws and policies.

One caution missing here concerns the constitutive influence of discourse. So, for instance, empirical research may show that married families produce happier, healthier children. No doubt this has much to do with the popular -- social and legal -- story that they do. Discourse helps create its own reality. Married families flourish in a discursive, policy and legal environment that favors them. This does not, however, prove that other sorts of families would not do an equally good job in a different, and entirely viable, context. In this deep sense, one to which this analytical philosopher pays little attention throughout the book, facts are slippery.

Some intimate caregiving arrangements may do better by children, but all families, it seems, threaten justice. In chapter five, Archard turns to the three counts on which the family is so accused. First, it is said that parents are unfairly subsidized by polities. Second, as Susan Moller Okin famously argued, within families power and resources are unequally distributed. And third, families sustain inequality among citizens by conveying unequal material and social benefits to their members. Children of the well-to-do, better educated, and healthier are likely to be better off. This fact motivated John Rawls' famous query: "Is the family then to be abolished?" (A Theory of Justice, quoted in Archard, 85).

Archard engages all three worries with care and balance, and concludes that each has its force: "the family within liberal society cannot [therefore] be provided with an unqualified defence" (99). A qualified defense where the pros outweigh the cons is all that is available. On the con side is, first, the fact that families sustain inequalities across society. Eliminating this feature, he insists, would come at too great a cost to freedom. Second, he argues, there is a principled justification for neither the choice of parenthood nor the unequal benefits parents receive as a result of polities' appropriate subsidies of families. Thus, adults who parent benefit unfairly but unavoidably. On the pro side, he claims,

[there] is the simple and undeniable fact that it is impossibly hard to think of any other social institution that could do as a good a job of protecting children from their natural vulnerability and dependence upon adults, and in preparing them for the assumption of their adult responsibilities (100).

The alternative he has in mind is Plato's "family state." The overwhelming coercive force and lack of individual choice involved in such an option weigh decisively against it. In short, "the existence of the family is not the best solution without qualification to the problem of bringing up children; rather it is, on the balance of considerations, the most feasible and desirable" (99).

Archard's conclusion will strike many as reasonable. It is. And yet, this pivotal point in his argument is surprisingly unfulfilling. Two issues stand out. First, he does less than he might to defend the position that parents benefit unfairly from family subsidies. The conclusion rests on the claim that the costs and benefits to parents and childless adults of the former's unpaid care-giving investments are uneven, in favor of parents. This may be true. But Archard never quite makes the case. Much of such a case hinges on the nature and benefits of intimate care-giving. And yet, as noted, his treatment of this feature of familial life is frustratingly brief. It fills about a page and a half where he talks about the virtues of privacy. The second issue with his argument here is related: his (sole) alternative to "family" seems to be Plato's family state. With respect to their childrearing functions, intimacy must be the feature that distinguishes these forms. Archard nods in that direction but never quite elaborates the case. Given that privacy seems to be the distinguishing feature of family, his entire argument would have been more satisfying had he spent more energy on this subject.

In the final full chapter of the book, Archard applies his considerable expertise to thinking about where technological and social changes may take families and what these changes might mean for arguments such as his. As with much of the book, the survey will be illuminating for specialists and non-specialists alike. The chapter emphasizes a conclusion running through the text: that "it is a grave mistake to legislate by definitional or conceptual fiat against the existence of certain kinds of family" (116). This conclusion strikes me as compelling. Largely, Archard has done a good and useful job in defending it. For anyone interested in political philosophy of the family and, especially, liberal political philosophy, this book is a very valuable resource. In that body of literature it will, I suspect, become a standard reference.