The Fetal Position: A Rational Approach to the Abortion Issue

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Chris Meyers, The Fetal Position: A Rational Approach to the Abortion Issue, Prometheus, 2010, 216pp., $19.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781591027683.

Reviewed by Hilde Lindemann, Michigan State University


Chris Meyers's The Fetal Position aims "to provide a philosophical analysis of some of the most common arguments offered by non-philosophers for and against abortion" and, in the process, to "serve as an example of how to engage in critical thinking about moral issues" (p. 7). He considers the "life is sacred" and "life begins at conception" arguments, counterarguments from twinning, arguments from responsibility, the potentiality argument, the Golden Rule argument, and the right-to-my-own body argument. As this array indicates, Meyers covers only the well-worn ground that is found in, say, standard bioethics textbooks. He offers no contributions of his own to the discussion, repeatedly asserting that he wants readers to weigh the arguments and come to their own conclusions. Moreover, he seems unaware of more recent philosophical work that teases out the moral implications of the intensely intimate relationship a pregnancy establishes between a woman and a child-to-be and the conditions under which a woman ought -- or ought not -- to commit herself to such a relationship. Any reader looking for fresh considerations of this kind will not find them here.

Sometimes Meyers writes as if the reader is a not-too-bright layperson who could use some highly simplified theoretical resources to grapple more effectively with the issues. At other times, the reader seems to be a captive undergraduate who is being taught critical thinking in an Intro to Philosophy course. The tone accordingly veers from a pedantic textbookishness to a hey-buddy-let's-have-a-drink camaraderie, leaving the reader feeling slightly whiplashed and a bit bemused. If, however, Meyers is not clear about exactly whom he is writing for, he does tell us explicitly whom the book is not for. It is written, he says, neither for good ole Mississippi boys who equate abortion with baby-killing, nor for "my left-wing feminist pals in my old college neighborhood of North Chicago. In short, fanatics on either side are not likely to find this book tolerable" (p. 13). His left-wing feminist pals would seem to include feminist philosophers of any stripe, as none of their arguments appear anywhere in the book. Work on abortion that dismisses thirty years' worth of feminist scholarship as fanaticism, however, cannot be taken seriously.

Meyers begins by dividing the popular debate into (only) two opposing worldviews: "the religious pro-life view with its belief in a soul and the secular pro-choice view with its more scientific conception of human life" (p. 8), asserting in passing and with no support that academic philosophers don't take the struggle between them very seriously. The rest of the book is devoted to explaining, from the "neutral" (p. 19) vantage point of philosophy, what is wrong with the usual arguments on both sides. His claim that philosophy has "no articles of faith, no fundamental commitments of its own" (p. 34) and therefore renders impartial judgments will strike many philosophers as naïve, as will his foray into the philosophy of language ("Since words are ultimately invented, we can assign whatever meaning we want to a word" [p. 38]). However, Meyers does motivate the thought that philosophical methods, including informal logic, making careful distinctions, and critical analysis of arguments, can turn down the heat and bring up the light in debates about abortion.

When he tackles the sanctity of life principle, he seems unaware that religions other than Christianity also espouse this principle and equally unaware of the history of the Catholic Church's shifting position on the question of when the fetus is ensouled. To assess the principle, he says, we must get clear about what we mean by 'soul,' as our conception may be self-contradictory or "it may be hopelessly vague, in which case we wouldn't know a soul if it bit us in the ass" (p. 49). He explains the Aristotelian conception, arguing that because the possession of a soul and nothing else constitutes being alive, Aristotle's view is "a kind of vitalism" (p. 54). This is, of course, a dreadful argument, as vitalism in its usual sense is a moral theory and not a metaphysical one and, in any case, has to do with the sanctity of human life only, not vegetative or animal souls. After a lengthy excursus into Descartes, he briefly lays out, without argument or citations, what he takes to be "substantive vitalism," which he follows by stacking the deck with his characterization of "the naturalist view" -- "the ordinary, commonsense views about being alive that are scientific rather than religious or supernatural" (p. 65).

In his treatment of the "life begins at conception" argument, Meyers lays out the biology to show the difficulty with pinpointing the exact moment of conception. His explanation, however, is strangely sloppy and hand-wavy. For example, he says that a week after fertilization, "there are only about 200 or so cells. At this point the cells have no structure, no particular arrangement. They are just a blob of undifferentiated cells. These are so-called stem cells" (p. 77). In point of fact, the blastocyst that has formed after a week takes on the shape of a hollow ball, consisting of the trophoblast that forms the outer layer and will eventually become the placenta, and the inner cell mass, which consists of the embryonic stem cells that will become the fetus. As these facts are widely known and easily obtainable, it seems odd that Meyers did not bother with them or, not having bothered with them, that he included a section on biology at all.

His discussion of twinning is meant further to complicate the "life begins at conception" argument and covers identical twins, conjoined twins, parasitic twins, and clones, throwing in a nod to chimeras for good measure. While the considerations he raises are the standard ones in the philosophical abortion literature (if life begins at conception, but one embryo can split into two persons, whose life began at conception?), Meyers runs into trouble in his discussion of cephalopagus twins. He says they have "only one head but can have two otherwise complete bodies," and after concluding that such a twin would be one person with seemingly only one soul, he writes, "I see no serious moral problems with cutting off one of the bodies, even though it will die, to save the head along with the other body, since doing so would not cause the death of any person" (p. 89). This remark displays a jaw-dropping insensitivity to actual people with unusual anatomies and no feeling at all for what their embodied lives are like.

And once again he does not have his facts straight. Cephalopagus twins have conjoined heads and necks, which produce malformations in the brain that are not compatible with life; such twins are stillborn or die within a few hours of birth. He concludes this discussion by asserting that "the sanctity of life principle, based on vitalism, has been shown to rely on a set of beliefs that do not fit with other things that we know about the world, and in particular about conception and early human development" (p. 99). The assertion is false; all he has shown is that "life begins at conception" is a confused claim. The sanctity of life principle does not stand or fall by this claim.

While Meyers's discussion of responsibility makes some good points, nowhere in it does he acknowledge the double standard that holds women, but not men, to account when sexual pleasure leads to an unwanted pregnancy -- the closest he comes is to point out, parenthetically, that his students "never consider the carelessness of the man, but let's set that aside" (p. 108). His analysis of the potentiality argument fares a little better, but it too is incomplete. For example, he declares that "the value of our future can depend on our (standing) desires for it, but the fetus's future can have no value because it can have no desire for it" (p. 130). There is a longstanding view in the literature to the effect that value is never intrinsic but rather bestowed on a thing by people who value it. But Meyers's declaration leaves out two important possibilities: first, that others could value the fetus's future and so make it valuable, and second, that fetuses could have an interest in being alive even if they cannot know they are alive.

As for what Meyers (following R. M. Hare) calls the Golden Rule argument against abortion -- since you would not consent to your own nonexistence, you cannot think abortion is permissible -- here his discussion goes all around the mulberry bush with intricate thought experiments that miss the main point: if you do not exist, there is no "you" there to protest your nonexistence. He does make the useful distinction between potential persons (already-existing embryos, for example) and possible persons (eggs and sperms that are not yet united), pointing out that abortion "need not be directly acting on a person, but it needs to be acting on something" (p. 145). But "you" do not exist until the embryo becomes "you"; it is not identical with "you," and certainly could not, in any possible world accessible to our own, protest its failure to develop into "you."

It is not until we are three-quarters of the way through this book that we finally arrive at considerations having to do with the pregnant woman. Meyers accounts for this by explaining that he has mostly been analyzing arguments on "the pro-life side," which primarily focus on the moral standing of the fetus. His rehearsal of Judith Jarvis Thomson's famous unconscious violinist argument is dutiful, though he fails to point out that a frequently raised objection to the argument -- that the woman owes life support to the fetus because it is her child, not a strange violinist -- begs the question. As Thomson's thought experiments with burglars breaking into your house and people-seeds landing on your carpet are designed to show, what is under consideration here is precisely whether the fetus must become your child. The bare biological connection between the woman and the fetus, like the geographical connection between the people-seed and your carpet, is arguably not enough to establish the responsibilities attendant on a mother-child relationship.

The concluding two chapters are odd because they do not address any specific set of arguments, the way all the preceding chapters do. Instead, they offer tours of utilitarianism and virtue ethics as applied to the abortion question. The chapter on utilitarianism contains nuggets like this one: "If a mountain climber falls to his death, he very likely will rue the day that he took up his hobby" (p. 192). He also declares that "the significant drop in crime in the late '90s is best explained by abortion becoming legal in the early '70s." To support this claim, he offers as evidence (without citation) the "fact" that "most abortions are sought by poor, uneducated single women whose children are more likely than the rest of the population to commit crimes as adults," and that "the reduction in crime for each state is proportionate to the abortion rate in the state" (p. 194). This is, of course, a post hoc ergo propter hoc argument, undeserving of any serious consideration.

The final chapter, on virtue ethics, takes up Rosalind Hursthouse's arguments in favor of a nuanced pro-choice position and concludes that she "ultimately leans slightly to the pro-life side" (p. 204) -- a nice illustration of what happens when the debate admits of only two positions. Oddly, he switches moral theories in midstream, as it were, by rounding out the chapter with arguments about fetuses' and pregnant women's rights and interests, and topping it off with a rousing invocation of Kant's dictum against treating people merely as a means. In the end, the confusions inherent in this final chapter offer a fairly accurate snapshot of the book as a whole. That's too bad, as such a complex and important topic requires the best that philosophy can bring to it.