The Figure of this World: Agamben and the Question of Political Ontology

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Mathew Abbott, The Figure of this World: Agamben and the Question of Political Ontology, Edinburgh University Press, 2014, 220pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748684090.

Reviewed by Jessica Whyte, University of Western Sydney


"What if we have been reading Agamben wrong?" This is the intriguing question posed by Mathew Abbott's new bookIndeed, while the reception of Agamben's work in the English-speaking world was bound up with the events that seemed to confirm its central theses -- the war on terror and the suspensions of basic rights it entailed, the opening of internment camps for unauthorized immigrants, etc. -- the descriptive value of his thought was double-edged. While it led to enormous interest in his work across a range of disciplines, it tended also to obscure the underlying philosophical claims about the nature of Western politics and metaphysics that provided the horizon of intelligibility for his more provocative arguments. Abbott's book is indicative of a shift of register that has sought instead to interrogate the philosophical stakes of Agamben's work. To treat Agamben as a political theorist who makes factual claims about events in the world, Abbott argues, is to misunderstand him. Agambenian concepts like "bare life" and the "state of exception," he argues, are largely unintelligible if understood sociologically. Instead, Abbott develops a compelling and philosophically sophisticated account of Agamben as engaged in the practice of "political ontology" -- that is, an interrogation of the political stakes of the very fact of the existence of the world.

Abbott starts with two premises: the first, to borrow the book's opening words, is "Things are." The second (and this is the claim that he will defend throughout the book) is that this first claim is directly political. These two claims are sufficient to locate Abbott's intervention within a distinct tradition of post-Heideggerian thought, for which contemporary political problems cannot be adequately grasped without considering the metaphysical logic in which they exist. Understanding Agamben's thought, he suggests, requires that we work with a Heideggerian distinction between the 'ontic' and the 'ontological'. If Agamben's political claims often appear hyperbolic and exaggerated, as many critics have suggested, Abbott argues that this is because political ontology is concerned with "the metaphysical structure of modernity, before it is concerned with ontic institutions" (188).

Abbott therefore presents himself as developing and defending Agamben's philosophy, yet he stresses that philosophy is not a matter of disinterested contemplation for Agamben, but rather a response to worldly existential problems. Political ontology, as Abbott defines it, "insists on the intertwining of ontology and politics, claiming theirs is a relation of mutual determination" (4). Throughout the book, he defends two, original political-ontological claims: "no life is bare" and "the ordinary is exceptional." Not only is "bare life" not a sociological concept (it is not the refugee, the camp inmate, etc.) but nor is it an ontic possibility for human beings. No human life is bare, he argues; no life can be irrevocably separated from its form of life. Rather, bare life is a metaphysical figure, an un-thought ground of politics. Abbott carries out a similar ontological re-orientation of the state of exception: in contrast to those who follow Carl Schmitt in viewing the exception as a temporary juridical figure, he argues that it is the very existence of the world that is miraculous and the ordinary that is exceptional.

Abbott's re-reading of Agamben is sophisticated and original, and he writes with lucidity and grace. The book is extraordinarily clear, and, unlike much of the literature on Agamben's work, it resists the slide into jargon and the tendency to repeat Agamben's more enigmatic claims as if they were self-evident. The book's great strength lies in its ability to illuminate Agamben's often-obscure political statements by re-situating them in their proper philosophical contexts. Central here is the philosophy of Heidegger, and Abbott is right both to highlight the German philosopher's critical importance for Agamben's thought and to stress that Agamben is making ontological claims about what he often terms "the politics of the West." Such a reading is an important corrective to those interpretations that have viewed Agamben's political statements in exclusively sociological terms, and thus tended to misunderstand the dynamic of his thought.

Yet, dismissing Agamben's 'ontic' claims as "hyperbole," as Abbott tends to do, runs into other problems. If many have found Agamben's thought so compelling, this is because they have seen explanatory value in his accounts of migration camps, contemporary economic government, or Guantanamo Bay, and have relied on his thought to think the realities of life in the post-'War on Terror' period. It is undoubtedly true that Agamben's claims are often lacking in empirical detail and have been ably criticized by those with a keener eye for 'ontic' detail. Yet, to treat such criticisms as arising from category errors -- a charge Abbott levels even at Agamben's own attempts to treat his concepts as if they had sociological referents -- is not without dangers.

These dangers become apparent when Abbott suggests that bare life is "the metaphysical condition of possibility of those ontic spaces of domination that Agamben calls 'camps', whether they be death camps, concentration camps, refugee camps, refugee 'detention centres', Guantanamo Bay, or whatever" (20). According to this reading, while in ontic terms such spaces are very different, they are nonetheless "ruled by the same metaphysical logic" (20). This is a classic Heideggerian move, which evokes both the German philosopher's contention that Europe is caught between Russia and America, which are "metaphysically the same," and his more infamous and disturbing remark (made in the wake of the 'Final Solution') that "Agriculture is now a motorized food industry, the same thing, in its essence, as the production of corpses in the gas chambers and the extermination camps".[1]

Abbott is not unaware of the danger that such metaphysical flattening will obscure the "situational specificities that are the stuff of real politics" (21), and he addresses the question of whether extracting Agamben's claims from a sociological register will blunt their critical purchase. He provides a two-fold response to this, which, to my mind, is not quite adequate to the problem he accurately identifies. First, he argues that another of Agamben's concepts, 'form-of-life', has a political purchase adequate to the political ontological condition he analyses. Secondly, he rightly argues that Agamben's thought is characterized by the "mutual determination" between political ontology and ontic politics -- or what he refers to elsewhere as "two-way traffic between the ontic and the ontological" (188). This second claim raises a problem, however: if Agamben's ontic claims are hyperbole and exaggeration, then this must have consequences for his political ontology. If this political ontology is conditioned by an account of ontic politics that is marked by what Abbott defines as a "tendency to pass over historical nuance," then this must have effects on the political ontology itself. Abbott tends to dismiss such lines of criticism, noting, for instance, that Ernesto Laclau's contention that Agamben's thought is "not sensitive enough to structural diversity" is "not wrong as much as it is beside the point" (30). Yet, if, as Agamben explains in the introduction to Homo Sacer, that work was conceived as "a response to the bloody mystifications of a new planetary order," then the kind of response his work offers will depend on its ability to adequately grasp the "new planetary order" in all its historical specificity.[2]

Before I return to this problem of the mutual determination of the ontic and the ontological, I would like to give a sense of the contours of Abbott's argument. Beginning with compelling readings of Heidegger's writings on poetry and the work of art, Abbott develops the argument that Agamben is more than simply a faithful inheritor of Heidegger's thought -- in fact, he is more faithful to the thought of his former teacher than Heidegger was. Heidegger erred, Abbott suggests, because he sought to re-mythologize poetic experience, and to treat the earth as a ground for a people. In dealing with Heidegger, Abbott admits to following "the principle of charity." In doing so, however, he neither brushes over, nor much less excuses, Heidegger's Nazism. Rather, he frames it as the point at which Heidegger betrayed his own thought by failing to see that it offered a third alternative -- neither nihilist reign of technology nor re-mythologization, but the thorough disenchantment of the world that is available to those who have ceased to wait for the Gods. This third path, Abbott correctly suggests, is that taken by Agamben, who offers the inhabitant of limbo, blissfully unaware of God's existence, as the paradigm of a form of life that has broken with the dialectic of catastrophe and redemption. The positive thought that Agamben derives from Heidegger, on this account, is a thought of the contingency and gratuity of the world, which can never be used to round a people or a destiny without ontic violence.

If Abbott portrays Agamben as a faithful Heideggerian, however, he acknowledges that this is not an exclusive fidelity, and turns to Walter Benjamin, whom Agamben has infamously described as the "antidote" that enabled him to survive Heidegger. Abbott takes up the question of bare life, through a reading of Benjamin's On the Critique of Violence.Abbott's reading of Benjamin, which posits his enigmatic "divine violence" as a figure of a new relation between human and animal, and portrays him as offering an atheist account of redemption, arguably does more to illuminate Agamben's messianism than that of Benjamin, whose relation to theology and to God, is, to my mind, more complex than the label of atheism does justice to. One of the real virtues of Abbott's book is its insistence that, despite the theological register in which many of Agamben's claims are made, his thought is oriented to a thoroughly desacralized form of life. This profane redemption is not quite an atheism; following Marx -- for whom socialism had no need either for God or for his negation -- Agamben, I would suggest, seeks not only to deny the problem of God but to "suppress it much more radically than any atheism."[3]

Abbott's positioning of the human/animal relation as central to Agamben's account of redemption paves the way for the book's strongest chapter, which turns directly to the question of human animality through a brilliant reading of Agamben's The Open. Here, Abbott also clarifies Agamben's relation to Heidegger, which he defines as the "ingenious transposition of the ontological difference onto biological categories" (129). This chapter serves to flesh out the first of Abbott's political/ontological claims: "no life is bare." Western politics, he argues, is founded on what he neatly terms "the forgetting of being (animal)" (130). Abbott illustrates this claim through a beautiful and insightful reading of Kafka's short-story, "The Burrow" -- a story to which Agamben has also addressed a reading that is perhaps his strongest critique of Heidegger. Abbott's reading is inspired by that of Maurice Blanchot, who suggests that the noise in the burrow, which so distresses the animal, is in fact the animal's own life; "what the animal hears," Abbott writes, "is nothing other than the sound of its own being alive, the whistle of its own breath" (132). The animal, Abbott argues, is haunted by its own animality. Thus, in contrast to those readings that have depicted the text as unfinished, Abbott argues there could be no "final confrontation" with the beast.

This question of a final confrontation with our own animality is one Abbott takes as central both to political ontology and to the thought of Friedrich Nietzsche. Distinguishing these approaches allows him to discern the specificity of Agamben's approach to the human/animal relation. The "fantasy of a full affirmation of or reconciliation with the beast," which Abbott sees as motivating Nietzsche's work, concedes too much, he argues, to what Agamben terms the "anthropological machine," which divides the human from the animal. The task, as Abbott sees it, is not to affirm that which has been excluded but to undermine the logic of inclusive-exclusion, by which animal life is captured by virtue of its exclusion. The very distinction between human and animal life, like the distinction between bios and zoe, is thus a "version of the more primordial ontological difference" (143). For Agamben, Abbott suggests, life is passivity, not power, and Agamben offers a vision of redemption that is resolutely non-hierarchical, founded on the original weakness or passivity of the human as living being.

The very success of this reading of the ontology of human animality raises, once more, the question of the relation between the ontic and the ontological. Abbott is surely right to suggest that the "political ontological change" that Agamben's work gestures to would not involve affirming natural life, but would instead recognize that the human/animal opposition is "itself a fantasy constitutive of the state as we know it" (137). Yet, when he goes on to say that this fantasy "conditions the insanity of Kafka's animal, just as it conditions the real exclusions of today's states: refugee camps, 'detention centres', Guantanamo Bay, etc.," this brushes over too easily the specificity of the philosophical, the literary and the political, and raises the question of what particular forms of conditioning are at work in each case. In what ways are these diverse spaces and figures conditioned by the ontological fracture at the heart of the human animal? And to what extent do political events and historical occurrences condition the metaphysical fantasy that seeks to found humanity on the sacrifice of a bare life? Such questions surely matter for any attempt to think, or indeed to act, against the various "real exclusions" to which Abbott gestures.

It is to this question of the possibility of political-ontological change to which the next section of the book turns. Here, Abbott turns his attention to that "happy life" that plays a central role in Agamben's profane redemption, arguing for an understanding of happiness that consists in living non-metaphysically in the world, rather than projecting oneself out of it by attempting to grasp it as a picture, or a "world-view." Abbott provides a wonderful account of the way this attempt to grasp the world as picture generates a relativism according to which we each "see the world" differently, and thus remain encased in our own private (and increasingly privatized) worlds, trapped in our own individual "view-points" (194). Abbott's insistence on the commonality of the world, on the fact that we are "exposed together to the same world" is a key contribution to thinking this happy life as both singularizing and common.

Such a shared being in the world is central to what the book's final chapter terms "the passing of the figure of this world" -- that is, the end of that picture-concept that keeps us projecting ourselves out of the world. Here Abbott makes two claims, which I take to be essentially accurate depictions of Agamben's own position: 1) "there are ontic conditions for ontological change;" 2) "many of these conditions have already been met" (189). The location of this overcoming may be surprising (though not to those who have pondered over Agamben's claim that "advertising and pornography that carry the commodity to the grave like hired mourners"[4]). It is

capital, in its rapacious abstraction of life, its undermining of the qualitative experience of work, its objectification of human relations and commodification of experience [that] has exacerbated the problems inherent in the picture-concept to such an extent that it has opened up the possibility of their resolution. (191)

Capitalism, Abbott suggests, has revealed the latent nililism of the world, and thus, opens up the opportunity for humans to appropriate our own groundlessness.

It is true that Agamben sees this possibility in spectacular capitalism, even if his more recent works on government and glory would seem to complicate the more overly redemptive cast he gives to spectacular capitalism in earlier works like The Coming Community and Means without Ends. He follows in a tradition of Marxian thinkers (Benjamin, Adorno, Guy Debord) for whom capitalism empties out the "use value" of commodities and thus frees things for new, non-utilitarian uses. Capital, as he sees it, empties out substantive identities and reveals the contingency of existing social arrangements. This contingency is central to the "thought of the good" that Abbott sees as available in political ontology -- and in Agamben's thought specifically. While the picture concept is marked by a sense of necessity -- "we think that things simply must be this way" (174) -- happiness consists in accepting the absolute contingency of the world.

While political ontology, as Abbott presents it, can prompt us to challenge the naturalization of current social arrangements, and undo the false forms of necessity that make existing political arrangements appear eternal, Susan Marks offers a warning against falling into the opposite trap, which she calls "false contingency." The concept of false contingency, Marks writes, reminds us "that things can be, and frequently are, contingent without being random, accidental or arbitrary."[5] Along this line, it is worth noting that capitalism not only melts all that is solid into air, freeing us from the illusion that existing social relations are fixed and necessary. It also generates forms of abstract compulsion, most characteristically the compulsion to sell one's labour-power in order to survive, that severely constrain the forms of non-instrumental life that Agamben's thought gestures toward. Without recognizing the way in which capitalism creates new forms of necessity there is a risk that the fascination with its capacity to melt the solids turns into simple apology for capitalism.

Agamben's own analysis largely misses the forms of compulsion that arise from the commodification of human potentiality. This matters because if (ontic) spectacular capitalism is the condition of possibility for ontological transformation, a correct understanding of it is indispensible. Abbott is stronger on identifying the way in which, for Agamben, capitalism "has opened up an unprecedented opportunity for human being to face up to -- and perhaps appropriate -- their own groundlessness" than he is on the question of the "overcoming of spectacular capitalism," which his thought nonetheless seems oriented to. Abbott does write that overcoming the picture concept "would require not only philosophical therapy, but perhaps also a change in the conditions that have produced us as forms of life that find themselves beguiled by it" (163.) If those conditions are the same one that lead human beings to relate to their own potentiality as a commodity, then this change will require both a rethinking of metaphysics, like Abbott offers, and forms of political experimentation that seek to overcome the abstract domination of capitalism. Abbott's resolutely ontological reading of Agamben opens up the possibility of breaking with those readings that have depicted his attempt to think a happy life as empty prophecy, and so frees his work for new uses. As Abbott stresses: "What remains after the passing of the figure of the world is just: the world" (196).

[1] Martin Heidegger, Introduction to Metaphysics, trans. Gregory Fried and Richard Polt, Yale University Press, 2014, 50.

[2] Giorgio Agamben, Homo Sacer: Sovereign Power and Bare Life, trans. Daniel Heller-Roazen, Stanford University Press, 1998, 12.

[3] Giorgio Agamben, The Man Without Content, trans. Georgia Albert, Stanford University Press, 1999, 126, note 14.

[4] Giorgio Agamben, "Dim Stockings" The Coming Community, trans. Michael Hardt, University of Minnesota Press, 1993, 50

[5] Susan Marks, "False Contingency", Current Legal Problems 62:1 (2009): 2.