The Free Animal: Rousseau on Free Will and Human Nature

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Lee MacLean, The Free Animal: Rousseau on Free Will and Human Nature, University of Toronto Press, 2013, 239pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781442644953.

Reviewed by Frederick Neuhouser, Barnard College, Columbia University


Lee MacLean treats a topic that is central not only to Rousseau's moral and political thought, but to much of the Western philosophical tradition as well: how to conceive of human beings such that their animal nature can be made consistent with their nature as rational and free. He focuses less on what Rousseau has to contribute to the philosophical enterprise of reconciling our freedom and animality -- figuring out how each must be conceived such that it is possible to attribute both to a single being -- than on the interpretive question of whether we should understand Rousseau's conception of human nature as ascribing free will to humans, especially in light of his apparent commitment, at least in the Second Discourse, to some version of naturalism in explaining human development. Two interpretive questions guide MacLean's study: first, whether Rousseau's ascription of free will to humans, especially in the Second Discourse, is to be taken at face value (rather than as part of an esoteric strategy to hide his "true" view from the masses); and second, what implications the ascription or non-ascription of free will has for interpreting his moral and political thought.

The first of these questions plays a significantly larger role in the book than the second. This is unfortunate for readers, like myself, who come to MacLean's book thinking that this interpretive issue is already clearly settled by the texts themselves. As MacLean recognizes, in Part I of the Second Discourse Rousseau unambiguously ascribes to humans a "power . . .  of choosing," which he characterizes as the ability to resist the promptings of nature that in other animals appear as instinct: "nature commands every animal, and the beast obeys. Man experiences the same impression, but he recognizes himself free to acquiesce or to resist." Moreover, Rousseau says just as clearly that to attribute freedom to humans is to ascribe to them a "metaphysical" property that lifts them above mere nature, conceived of as a thoroughly deterministic domain governed by causal laws: "in the power of willing . . . are found purely spiritual acts about which nothing is explained by the Laws of Mechanics."[1] Similar ideas are expressed in Emile (though, admittedly, in the voice of the Savoyard Vicar).

Most of MacLean's book is devoted to presenting a clear, careful, and convincing argument that Rousseau was sincere in his avowals of free will. The textual arguments offered here are deft and attentive to nuance, and, unlike most treatments of Rousseau by philosophers, they cover not only his three central philosophical texts, but also less studied works such as Reveries of the Solitary Walker. Chapter 3 contains one of the best extended treatments of Emile's "Profession of Faith of the Savoyard Vicar" that I have read. It provides not only a masterful discussion of the Vicar's remarks on free will, but also a persuasive account of how, more generally, interpreters should approach this notoriously problematic text-within-a-text. Especially intriguing is the suggestion that the religious views expressed by the Vicar are to be read as playing a crucial role in The Social Contract's argument that a legitimate republic requires a civil religion (114). MacLean's impressive interpretive talent is on display in other chapters as well. She demonstrates a sure and confident grasp of Rousseau's texts, including unpublished material. Even more impressive, she knows a surprising amount about the views of Rousseau's contemporaries and predecessors on the topic of free will -- Buffon, Montaigne, and Condillac, for example -- and she very helpfully brings this knowledge to bear on her carefully constructed interpretations of Rousseau. For this reason her book is a must-read for scholars interested in the historical context within which Rousseau's views develop.

The main task of MacLean's book, then, is to be convince readers that Rousseau believes that humans are metaphysically free and that their freedom lifts them above the deterministic realm of nature inhabited by all other animals. If Rousseau himself says this straightforwardly, however, why is such detailed scrutiny of the interpretive question called for? To whom, in other words, is MacLean's book addressed? According to MacLean, "there is . . . a long history of doubting that Rousseau actually stood behind his more edifying pronouncements," including, presumably, his statements regarding free will (8). Voltaire and Adam Smith had such doubts, she claims, but the passage she cites from Smith's famous review of the Second Discourse does not support this claim in relation to free will (160-61), and I was unable to find clear evidence in the book that Voltaire doubted the sincerity of Rousseau's claims on the same topic. This leaves Leo Strauss and his followers, and as the book's argument unfolds, it becomes clear that they, with their claims that Rousseau's utterances about free will mask his "true" esoteric teaching, are the intended audience of MacLean's efforts to show that Rousseau did believe that humans were metaphysically free. This means that one has to be very impressed by the hermeneutic acrobatics of the Straussians on this issue to be thoroughly engaged by MacLean's efforts to answer the first main question of her book. (MacLean also notes a more philosophical reason for calling Rousseau's avowals of free will into question -- its incompatibility with materialism -- but even though Rousseau often seems sympathetic to both materialism and naturalism, I see no textual evidence to suggest that he ever flirted with the "comprehensive materialism" (14) that would be incompatible with his avowal of metaphysical freedom. On the contrary, Rousseau appears to reject materialist monism just as explicitly as he embraces free will (25, 84, 99f.).

Fortunately, in the course of refuting her Straussian opponents, MacLean touches on many topics that will be of interest to other readers as well. She shows, for example -- also in debate with theStraussians -- that an interpreter of the Second Discourse is not forced to choose between free will and perfectibility as the motor behind human development. For, as she sensibly points out, the two are not merely compatible. Rather, the unfolding of perfectibility relies on the exercise of free will since the latent faculties that make up the former are awakened only when humans respond to environmental changes freely, that is, in ways not determined by instinct. Moreover, she is correct to emphasize that Rousseau needs the thesis of free will in order to show that the ills of society, including vice, are due not to nature -- and hence to nature's creator, God -- but to misuses of human freedom, which, because they bring about those ills unintentionally and without foresight, are not morally imputable to the agents whose actions produce them (58).

The most important contribution MacLean makes to our understanding of the importance of free will to Rousseau's anthropology is her account of how amour propre depends on it. One of her innovations is to point out that, in characterizing the distinction between human beings and other animals, Rousseau emphasizes not only humans' possession of free will but also their consciousness of being free. She argues convincingly that our awareness of our freedom plays a crucial role in Rousseau's account of how we, unlike other animals, are able to come to care about and seek the good opinions of others: regarding others' treatment of us as expressing their valuations of us presupposes our taking their behavior to be an expression of their free agency. This is an important point, and the book shows how this idea informs Rousseau's account of amour propre in both Emile and the Second Discourse. It is a little surprising, however, that in this part of the book MacLean makes virtually no use of the substantial philosophical literature on amour propre that has been published in the last few decades. (N. J. H. Dent's path-breaking book on this topic does not even appear in the book's index.) In contexts such as this, it becomes clear that what MacLean is most interested in is wrestling on her own with primary texts, and there can be no doubt that she is very good at doing that. Still, a more extensive philosophical engagement with recent, non-Straussian secondary literature, on amour propre and other topics, would have enriched her reconstructions of Rousseau's positions and helped to insert them more directly into relevant contemporary debates.

MacLean's treatment of her second main question is less satisfactory than her extensive and penetrating discussion of free will. While she effectively shows the importance free will has for Rousseau's anthropology, her treatment of its moral and political significance is thinner. It comes down to the unsurprising claim that Rousseau's critiques of arbitrary government, absolute monarchy, and "voluntary slavery" depend on viewing humans as metaphysically free. Although this claim may be correct, the book would have benefited from a more extensive discussion of the difference and relation between free will, as a metaphysical property of humans (which, presumably, no political order could ever destroy), and the politically relevant conception of freedom at issue when Rousseau claims, for example, that "peoples have given themselves chiefs to defend their freedom" (29). If no political chiefs, however tyrannical, could take away their subjects' metaphysical freedom (their freedom of will), what is the type of freedom that such chiefs threaten to eliminate, and in what relation, if any, does it stand to freedom of the will?

At one point MacLean distinguishes freedom of will from freedom of action (22), and this is a promising path to take, but more needs to be said about whether, and why, the politically relevant "freedom of action" -- what Kant calls "external freedom" -- requires thinking of citizens as metaphysically free. (MacLean broaches the issue again when she asserts that free will is a necessary condition of moral freedom (91), but this claim, too, though plausible, begs for more discussion, especially of how the freedom from being governed by appetite alone that is associated with moral freedom relates to the freedom from instinct that Rousseau initially claims to be a metaphysical fact about us -- and, so, not something that requires a politically realized "moral freedom" in order to be achieved.) MacLean's failure to go into more detail concerning the relation between metaphysical freedom and freedom of action (bound up with the absence of external restraints) is all the more surprising because one striking passage of the Second Discourse appears to dissociate the two, attributing something like a desire to be externally free to animals even though he clearly denies their metaphysical freedom: "As an untamed Steed . . . struggles impetuously at the very sight of the bit . . . so barbarous man . . . prefers the most tempestuous freedom to a tranquil subjection."[2] In locating the desire to avoid external restraint in nature itself, Rousseau seems to admit that an animal's concern for its external freedom does not depend on its having free will. It is surely too much to ask of a single book that it resolve all the puzzles connected with Rousseau's complex views on freedom, but this issue is central to the case MacLean is most interested in making, that Rousseau ascribed free will to humans and regarded it as a principal way in which humans are different from other animals.

[1] All citations are from the Second Discourse in The Discourses and Other Early Political Writings, trans. Victor Gourevitch (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997), 140-41.

[2] Ibid., 177.