The Fullness of Being: A New Paradigm for Existence

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Miller, Barry, The Fullness of Being: A New Paradigm for Existence, University of Notre Dame Press, 2002, 184 pp, $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 0-268-02864-8.

Reviewed by Peter Forrest, University of New Zealand


The Fullness of Being is the third volume of Barry Miller's trilogy, the others being From Existence to God (1992) and . Most Unlikely God (1996). In it Miller takes his place alongside Alfarabi, Avicenna, and Aquinas, in arguing that existence is a genuine property. First he argues that "exists" is a first-order predicate, applicable to concrete individuals, and that it is not to be paraphrased in Fregean fashion using the existential quantifier. He infers that existence is a genuine property; and goes on to argue that, far from adding nothing, the existence of a thing is that by virtue of which it has its other properties. Finally, he uses his account of existence to defend the conception of God as Subsistent Existence.

After introductory remarks in Chapter One, Miller argues in Chapter Two that "exists" is a predicate applicable to concrete individuals. The argument has two parts. The first, defensive, part is that the alleged paradoxes resulting from treating "exists" as a predicate are instead to be diagnosed as the result of treating non-existence as a property (p.39). His case here starts by noting our capacity to refer to things that do not exist, as in "Socrates no longer exists", but grants that to have a property something must exist, whence the diagnosis of the alleged paradox.

The second part of the argument is that all attempts to paraphrase examples such as "Socrates no longer exists" fail. The attempts at paraphrase fall into two groups. First there are those in the tradition of Frege, which seek to replace the name "Socrates" by a predicate and then use the existential quantifier. Of these, perhaps the most promising is one which Miller attributes to Frege himself on p. 8 and mentions again on p.43 as a variant of Quine's resort to pegasizing. On it, to say, for instance, that Socrates exists is to say that something is identical to Socrates. I will call it the proto-Fregean paraphrase because Frege goes on to treat the existential quantifier as a second-order predicate, which complicates matters. The proto-Fregean paraphrase of "Socrates no longer exists" is, "There once was something identical to Socrates but there now no longer is anything identical to Socrates"; or, if you prefer, "There (tenselessly) is someone identical to Socrates but anyone identical to Socrates is located wholly in the past." Miller discusses the proto-Fregean paraphrase directly in the context in an appendix on the neo-Meinongians, Parsons and Zalta. Presumably he endorses Zalta's criticism, which, as I understand it, is that we may infer from "John's paper is about (the character) Hamlet" and "Hamlet does not exist" that "John's paper is about someone who does not exist." This provides a case for paraphrasing "Hamlet does not exist" not as "There is no one identical to Hamlet, " but as "There is no one who exists who is identical to Hamlet". Presumably, some such consideration as this prevented Frege, Russell and Quine from resting content with this proto-Fregean paraphrase. But, as Miller, following Geach, points out, these various ways of "improving" on the proto-Fregean paraphrase merely result in the absurdity that the lament that Socrates no longer exists would not be about Socrates at all, but about a name or a property.

The other main group of attempted paraphrases are those which concentrate on the predicate "exists", seeking to show that it is not primitive. Thus Miller considers the suggestion that to exist is to instantiate some property (p.53), which he rejects because that would exclude bare particulars. This is an interesting objection of Miller's because bare particulars are just the sort of item we would gladly exclude from our ontology. I take it, however, that to paraphrase away the predicate "exists" is here taken as establishing the conceptual equivalence of "exists" with its paraphrase. And bare particulars would seem to be conceivable even if we claim to know a priori they are impossible. Another suggestion, due to Jonathan Barnes (p. 48), is that "exists" can be paraphrased as "is somewhere". Here Miller argues that it is at least conceivable that there are concrete individuals that are not located. Readers might wonder why we do not modify Barnes' thesis to say that "exists" can be paraphrased as "is now" and hence "existed" as "is then ". The answer, presumably, is that Miller assumes that all predicates applied to concrete individuals are taken to be tensed, so "is then" is nonsense.

I would like to note four points where it is quite clear that Miller's is a non-revisionary project--one which analyses our pre-theoretical language without seeking to reform it. The first is the semi-Meinongian insistence that we can refer to what does not exist. The second is in the use of the bare-particular counter-example. The third is similar, and occurs when Miller uses non-located concrete individuals as counter-examples to Barnes. The fourth, which is less explicit, is in the assumption that predicates applicable to concrete individuals are always tensed. All these can be justified but only by closely adhering to the way we actually use our language.

In Chapter Two, then, Miller has argued that there is a perfectly coherent but primitive use of "exists" as applied to concrete individuals. In Chapter Three, he argues from this to the further conclusion that existence is a property, that is, a real property - as opposed to a "Cambridge property" where "Cambridge" is an alienans adjective. As I understand it, he relies on the following sufficient condition for a predicate F( ) to correspond to a real property: If F(b) but it is contingent that the predicate F( ) applies to a concrete individual b, and if the predicate F( ) does not admit of a relational analysis, then b has a real property, F-ness. Using this criterion, it follows that existence is a real property of those concrete individuals that exist contingently. The criterion itself depends for its plausibility very much on the non-revisionary character of Miller's metaphysics, which he frankly admits (pp 67-69). It is, I think, this non-revisionary character rather than an admiration for Aquinas that gives Miller's work its somewhat scholastic flavor.

In Chapter Three, Miller turns to the more controversial but also the more original part of his work, concerning the nature of existence. At the outset he argues for an ontology in which universal properties have as their instances particular properties, which in turn inhere in concrete individuals. Thus wisdom has for an instance the wisdom of Socrates, which inheres in Socrates. Clearly this is more complicated than either the thesis that universals are directly instantiated by concrete individuals or the currently popular trope theory. Miller arrives at this complex position using ordinary language as a guide to ontology. His argument is based upon the Fregean insight that predicates are incomplete constituents of propositions. From this he infers that the propositions "Socrates is wise" and "Aristotle is wise" do not share the same predicate. From that he further infers that the properties directly corresponding to the predicates are not the same, even though, as a concession, he allows that there is also a universal, wisdom. An obvious objection might be that the predicate is itself a universal instantiated by many distinct propositions, but that is not consistent with the straightforward view of how the proposition "Socrates is wise" is constituted by "Socrates" and the predicate in question. The failure of this objection supports Miller's contention that the predicate in "Socrates is wise" cannot be detached from that proposition. Miller would not, I think, object to the judgment that the overall strength of this argument for property-instances depends on just how closely ontology is meant to mirror language.

Next Miller argues that this property-instance of Socrates' existence must not be thought of, as are his other property-instances, as logically posterior to Socrates. This raises the question of just how Socrates is related to his existence, and answering this is the topic of Chapter Four and Five, where we are introduced to a metaphor, in which Socrates is said to be the bound of his existence (pp97-99). Miller considers a lump of butter. The surface or bound only exists because the ball of butter exists. Nonetheless in simple cases the shape (and size) of the butter is implied or determined by the shape (and size) of its boundary. Although this is not Miller's terminology, we may say that the shape of the butter supervenes on the shape of the surface, meaning that no two lumps of butter with the same shaped surface have different shapes. This supervenience claim fails in more complicated cases. For instance the shape of the land does not supervene on the shape of the shore dividing land from sea, because it might have been the case that the land occupied exactly the area actually occupied by the sea and vice versa. I take it, however, that the individual's existence always supervenes on the individual even though it depends on its existence not vice versa. And I take it that the point of the metaphor of bounds is to prevent us carelessly assuming that the supervenient, as defined, depends on that on which it supervenes. This is important because it explains just why existence might have seemed redundant, being supervenient.

Finally, in Chapter Six, Miller applies his account of existence to the conception of God as Subsistence Existence, which he defends as a limit case of bounded existence, standing to less and less restricted bounded existents much as a circle stands to regular polygons with more and more sides. Here he assumes that we may (partially) order concrete individuals as more and less restricted by their bounds, so that Socrates is vastly less restricted than an amoeba which in turn is vastly less restricted than an electron. Miller is then able to reject Kenny's contention that the notion of pure being (understood as Subsistent Existence) is quite empty (p.135). For while the universal existence would indeed be extraordinarily thin, being equivalent, I suppose, to being a concrete individual, Miller is considering the property-instances, Socrates' existence, Aristotle's existence, etc. and we may say that all of Socrates' other property-instances inhere in Socrates by virtue of Socrates' existence. So, the limit case of less and less restricted bounded existence is, far from being empty, totally full.

Overall Miller's work on existence is a remarkable achievement, and even if not persuaded as to the correctness of his account, readers will, I hope, be persuaded that it is one among other tenable accounts, and that it offers a coherent way of conceiving of God as Subsistent Existence. The reason why we might well not be persuaded is that, as I have noted, the whole case depends on the assumption that ontology mirrors language. But why should we believe that? Miller quotes Dummett approvingly, "language may be a distorting mirror but it is the only mirror we have" (p.69). Let us grant that language is a guide to ontology in much the way that what we perceive is a guide to the world around us. The latter does not commit us to the reality of secondary qualities, and likewise the former does not commit us to including in our ontology correlates of all constituents of propositions. Pursuing this analogy further, we might suggest that we should start with a manifest ontology, which does mirror language and then correct it piecemeal as a result of argument. Thus if we can do without property-instances, then by Ockham's Razor we should not believe in them.

To sum up, this is "a difficult but rewarding book". Even if not totally persuasive it should be taken as successfully exhuming existence, and as a brilliant defense of Subsistent Existence. It should be required reading for those philosophers interested in the topic of existence, and it is a significant contribution to philosophical theology.