The Future of Continental Philosophy of Religion

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Clayton Crockett, B. Keith Putt, and Jeffrey W. Robbins (eds.), The Future of Continental Philosophy of Religion, Indiana University Press, 2014, 292pp., $40.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253013880.

Reviewed by Peter C. Blum, Hillsdale College


An event that declares its intent to explore "the future of ____" necessarily constitutes a promissory and normative mapping, in addition to whatever selective recollection, gathering, describing, or typologizing it might offer. Another way to put this would be to observe that no gaze into the future is innocent. A philosophical future is a future that is, as yet, unthought, and it is worth remembering that any attempt to think what is as yet unthought is unavoidably an attempt to drag it -- perhaps prematurely -- into thought.

This collection originated at the fourth Postmodern Culture and Religion Conference at Syracuse University in 2011. I was at that conference, and so was able to hear the original presentations of some (though far from all) of the papers. In what follows, I want to provide philosophically inclined readers, including those who do not work primarily in continental philosophy, with a basis for judging how important it might be to attend to the book. But I also want to explore certain dimensions of the event (in a broader sense) that is the book as well as the conference.

The premise that situates the conversation historically is that we are now philosophizing after several momentous deaths. The most momentous is the death of God, in the sense given by Hegel, Nietzsche, and many who have since followed their lead in thinking "religion." The other deaths that are significant are those of the first-generation "postmodern" thinkers, often thought of in association with the events of 1968 (the editors' introduction explicitly lists Derrida, Deleuze, Foucault, and Levinas). These figures have been central to conversation regarding "the return to religion" in continental philosophy. Those who are not deeply familiar with this as a set of issues may at least have some feel for it by way of the popular work of John D. Caputo (an instigator and central figure in this event). Since his turn to Derrida and to "radical hermeneutics," Caputo has been one of the most outspoken representatives and defenders of a postmodern philosophy that is friendly rather than hostile to religious and theological reflection. He has sought vigorously to debunk (modern) dogmatically secular biases that continue to haunt postmodern thought. This book may be considered a "progress report" on the postmodern religious reflection that has presumably been freed by such debunking, and this provides a lens through which to begin considering its strengths and weaknesses.

For anyone interested in philosophy of religion and seeking overall orientation on this conversation, significant help will be found in these pages. Central to the book's organization is a typology of three general thematic emphases that dominate the conversation as it has unfolded in recent continental literature. The three themes are: (i) the messianic, (ii) liberation, and (iii) plasticity. For each, a prominent thinker is placed center-stage, as a paradigmatic reference point: Caputo (the messianic), Philip Goodchild (liberation), and Catherine Malabou (plasticity).

The messianic may be the most familiar and accessible theme, partly due to Caputo's influence, which has overflowed the bounds of continental philosophy in any narrow sense and gained a significant following in philosophy of religion and in theology in recent years. Caputo's emphasis on the messianic draws from Derrida's writing, where the "to come" (à venir) is not something that is expected to become present at a calculable, specifiable point in time. Since the mid 1990's, Caputo has been developing this in relation to the notion of "event," as a disruption of time in the direction of openness and indeterminacy. What has become more salient recently is his emphasis on the contrast between what he terms Kantian and Hegelian streams of postmodern religious thought, and his identification of his sense of 'messianic' with the Hegelian stream.

For readers without strong background in continental philosophy of religion, I recommend looking at this contrast as the most helpful way to grasp what is at stake in this volume in relation to the motif of the death of God. The point d'entrée, and to my mind the one piece that is a must-read for anyone interested in philosophy of religion, is B. Keith Putt's, "Friends and Strangers/Poets and Rabbis." It is a reflection on the work of Caputo and that of Merold Westphal, each of whom responds to Putt. It directly portrays the richness of the conference session, which celebrated the retirement of both "elder statesmen" in postmodern philosophy and religious reflection. While the spirit of Putt's remarks aims at holding the contributions of both together in tension, the ways in which both responses accentuate their differences is telling. This seems to me especially strong in the case of Caputo, who states: "Westphal descends from Kant through Kierkegaard and Barth, whereas I descend from Hegel through Kierkegaard and Tillich" (51). With the line drawn between these two columns, Caputo's account fills in the appropriate series of binaries. In the "Kantian" column one finds theism, orthodoxy, apologetics (in the same column as Barth?), incarnation, and perhaps a remainder of the supernatural. In the "Hegelian" column we find embrace of the death of God, heterodoxy, poetics, carnality, and naturalism. This distinction provides a rough but adequate characterization of what unifies the entire volume/event in that it presents the Hegelian trajectory as The Future. After providing further summary, I will return to this way of seeing The Future below.

As I've already hinted, The Messianic is consistent with a naturalistic outlook. 'Naturalistic' here does not mean reductive in just any sense, but it is anti-supernaturalistic and broadly materialistic. Caputo writes: "I think that there is only one world, that of the flux unfolding in space and time, the flux that is spacing-timing, which James Joyce called the 'chaosmos'" (52). Event, in the rich sense developed in recent continental thought, is preserved in the name of God, by resisting the idea that an entity-God breaks into nature from without at a specifiable moment in time. This naturalistic preservation is explored from several angles in part 1. Edward Mooney provides an interesting exploration of natality in Derrida and Julia Kristeva, with an eye to Kierkegaard's Fear and Trembling. Essays by Steven Shakespeare, Leon Niemoczynski, and Katharine Sarah Moody approach God-talk in relation to speculative realism, and (especially in Moody's essay) a/theological materialism.

In part 2, the tone is set by Philip Goodchild, who identifies philosophy as liberating by way of the opening of alternative possibilities, particularly in light of a rejection of Enlightenment rationality. Here the essays (by Devin Singh, Gavin Hyman, Joseph Ballan, Christina M. Gschwandtner, and Noëlle Vahanian) incline most clearly toward an ethical practice of philosophy of religion. Of these essays, the most lively and suggestive on my reading is Hyman's "'Between Justice and My Mother': Reflections on and between Levinas and Žižek." Recalling the well-known statement attributed to Camus ("Between justice and my mother, I would choose my mother"), Hyman portrays the tension between particularity and universality in a way that should be interesting to many contemporary moral philosophers.

Part 3, which is probably the most difficult to approach for those not already involved in these conversations, is centered on the concept of plasticity, as the latter has been developed by Catherine Malabou. Here the volume's editors emphasize how Malabou provides a vision of time and the future that is at odds with Caputo's (underlining how the volume is not proposing just one possible Future for Continental philosophy of religion). Plasticity becomes a neurological concept for Malabou. So the consideration of temporality, and the articulation of a postmodern materialism, is drawn into much more explicit conversation with the natural sciences. Yet there are important conceptual points of continuity with the Derridean "à venir" and with deconstruction. In fact, Malabou's thought is presented as affirming that "nothing is sacred and everything is deconstructible" (15), in stark contrast to the insistence by Derrida and Caputo that justice is the non-deconstructible condition for the possibility of deconstruction. Both space and lack of mastery on my part prevent further explication of part 3, but I hope that I have provided sufficient basis for interested readers to dive in on their own.

The strengths of this volume are not adequately captured by my summary. Philosophical writing at its best always has a fecundity that escapes or overflows its apparent presuppositional moorings, providing insight and inspiration that is not bound by the truth, falsity, plausibility, or at times even the rationality of propositional claims. The discipline of taking bearings within a philosophical conversation is a fruitful one, and I do recommend a careful perusal of the book by anyone with interest in its themes. Beyond this, the picture (albeit simplified) of a "Hegelian" rather than "Kantian" inclination accurately situates a pervasive antipathy toward what is characterized throughout as the "fideism" of the "Kantian" column. By embracing both the typology of Messianic/liberation/plasticity, and that of Kantian (bad)/Hegelian (good), the book provides a valuable sounding of the Zeitgeist in current Continental philosophy of religion circles.

But as I noted at the outset, no gaze into the future is innocent. This is so because, among other things, "the future" too easily becomes "The Future." In conclusion, I wish to register some strong reservations regarding The Future that is presented and with the supposed Kantian/Hegelian difference that sets the stage. While I have often identified myself as someone who is doing Continental Philosophy of Religion, the picture painted by this book seems to present me with an "either/or", which I do not find compelling. If there is a dividing line between the columns headed "Kantian" and "Hegelian", then that line runs through my own philosophical soul. Theism in a "classical" sense seems to be simply excluded from the "Hegelian" side, with "poetics" conjoined to naturalism and materialism, making it prima facie difficult to distinguish the general perspective from that developed decades ago by Gordon D. Kaufman.

Of course, I suspect that it varies widely, among the postmodern thinkers in this conversation, how and to what degree the departure from theism is manifest. But if I refuse to see classical theism and postmodern thought as an "either/or", then must I be a Kantian fideist at best, or maybe someone who just isn't postmodern at all? I most emphatically do not mean to question the validity of pursuing the research program represented by this progress report! I only worry at its product being called The Future. My point is not that I am simply a classical theist. My point is that I am not simply a classical theist. I describe these worries in the first person, but I am fairly confident that I am far from alone.