The German Gita: Hermeneutics and Discipline in the German Reception of Indian Thought

Placeholder book cover

Bradley L. Herling, The German Gita: Hermeneutics and Discipline in the German Reception of Indian Thought, 1778-1831, Routledge, 2006, 358pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0415976162.

Reviewed by Thom Brooks, University of Newcastle


Bradley Herling's The German Gita is an outstanding achievement, charting the reception of the Bhagavad Gita in the late 18th and early 19th centuries in Germany with rich detail. This was a period of increasing interest in (and knowledge of) Asian culture. In this book, Herling explains in rich detail the legacy of the Gita's reception in German thought.

In its reception, German philosophers took the Gita as the quintessential statement of Indian philosophy. In fact, these philosophers often refer to 'the Gita' and 'Indian philosophy' interchangeably. The story begins with Johann Gottfried Herder, whom Herling credits as 'the first major figure in the German intellectual tradition to take a serious interest in interpreting Indian culture' (41). At this time, knowledge about India (and its religious and philosophical heritage) was entering Germany for the first time.

Herling's story then unfolds, including discussion of Friedrich and August Schlegel, Wilhelm von Humboldt, and concluding with G. W. F. Hegel. Major achievements are carefully detailed.  Two of the most important are Friedrich Schlegel's translation of the Gita from Sanskrit, a new translation rather than a cleaning up of previous translations, such as Wilkins's (which Herder used), although it curiously stops at chapter eight, omitting the second half of the Gita (142); and August Schlegel's full translation of the Gita from Sanskrit into Latin in 1823. In the end, it does appear that the appearance of German translations of the Gita had an important influence on German philosophers of the time. The Gita came to represent Indian philosophy in full, a revealing fact in itself. Westerners came to see the Gita as having a Bible-like status for Hindus, a status the Gita in fact has never held. This misconceived status remains influential, and to this day the Gita remains easily the most well known work in Indian thought in the West.

I should note several worries I had with The German Gita. For example, a worry throughout is that whilst Herling presents a clear argument in favour of the view that many influential German figures of the time took an interest in the Gita and that certain thoughts in the Gita related to their writings, the influence of the Gita in furthering, say, Herder's or Hegel's projects was much less clear. What did Hegel change because of his reading of the Gita? The answer appears to be 'nothing'. Of course, Herling is quite right to argue that many prominent German philosophers of the time took more seriously the Gita than many contemporary philosophers today (and to our discredit). However, he fails to clearly demonstrate the precise influence of this interest on the work of these German philosophers.

Another worry -- particularly troubling and baffling -- is that Herling nowhere tells us what exactly this Gita is about.  Not once does he mention that the Gita is a part of the larger Hindu epic, the Mahabharata, the Gita itself being a dialogue between two figures: Krishna and Arjuna. (It is telling that neither Krishna nor Arjuna are mentioned even once in the index; I found few mentions of Arjuna (113, 142, 238-9) and Krishna (142-6, 189-90, 195, 215, 217, 239) in the text. Krishna is confusingly rendered both as 'Krishna' and 'Krsna' [see 189]).

The lack of any account regarding what the Gita is about (itself a matter of controversy) is coupled with a further fundamental and disturbing problem:  the omission of any philosophical discussion of the Gita's contents (as well as its context). If The German Gita is attempting to chart the reception of the Gita, then it is surely important to spell out clearly what the Gita is about. How else can we tell how well it has been received, if at all? It would clearly have been most helpful to have an introduction to this complex and highly fascinating book before discussing how it might have been received by German philosophers afterwards.

These fundamental matters are serious flaws, in my view. However, this should not detract us from the central topic: the initial reception of the Gita in important German philosophical circles in the late 18th and early 19th centuries. But I believe there is a fundamental flaw here as well. Indeed, the main surprise with the German Gita is clearly its exclusion of Arthur Schopenhauer, who surely deserves great credit for his interest in Indian philosophy and his consideration of it in his own work. Herling's rationale for omitting Schopenhauer is hardly satisfactory: ' his contributions come after my historical purview' (ix). This is a serious mistake. Schopenhauer rather famously (and alone of all major Western philosophers to my knowledge) had the Gita, rather than the Bible, on his bedside table and would read from it most nights. His interest in the Gita (which he took to characterize the Indian mind) clearly influenced many who came after him, not least Friedrich Nietzsche, and he was a far greater influence in maintaining and preserving the reception of Indian philosophy in German thought than perhaps any other figure (perhaps even Hegel). Moreover, his exclusion is unjustifiable for another reason. Those figures examined in The German Gita are not, say, all German Idealists or all Romantics. So then what ties them together in such a way that ought to exclude Schopenhauer? Nothing. Whilst one cannot include everything, the omission of Schopenhauer from this study is in my view a rather serious mistake.

This book will fascinate specialists already knowledgeable about the Bhagavad Gita with an interest in its early Western influence two hundred years ago, and I have learned much from its pages. Of course, I am of the view that the story could have been strengthened. But that story remains well worth telling.