The Globalization of Ethics: Religious and Secular Perspectives

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William M. Sullivan and Will Kymlicka (eds.), The Globalization of Ethics: Religious and Secular Perspectives, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 305pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521700214.

Reviewed by Stephen C. Angle, Wesleyan University


Like other titles in the prestigious Ethikon Series in Comparative Ethics, the present volume brings together scholars representing a range of viewpoints in order to shed light on an ethical issue of current importance. Unlike the other members of the series, The Globalization of Ethics tackles the very premise of activities like the series itself. What does the "globalization of ethics" entail? What are some of its different modalities, and how are they viewed from a range of religious and secular perspectives? One of the many strengths of the volume is that it shows the various perspectives that organize its core chapters -- international law, Judaism, Christianity, Buddhism, Islam, Confucianism, natural law, liberalism, and feminism -- are themselves internally contested. Every one of these chapters is well done and can stand on its own as a summary of how the given tradition views the project of ethics in an interconnected and yet pluralistic world. In addition to these nine chapters, the volume also contains provocative introductory and concluding chapters by the two editors, and a series of appendices containing relevant documents that are referred to in various chapters. Rather than summarize the book's summaries, my approach here will be to engage with its contents thematically, which seems more in keeping with how the authors and editors hope the volume will be read. Collectively, the essays in the volume certainly present no final answers to the many challenges of globalizing ethics, but its contents are rich, sometimes novel, and always stimulating. It is well worth the attention of anyone with an interest in how to think about ethics in the context of our contemporary world.

The book's opening essay, by Will Kymlicka, offers a valuable framework for thinking about the challenges of globalizing ethics. He begins from the premise that "transnational debates about ethics are increasingly unavoidable, given the intensity of interaction among the world's cultures. As globalization increases, ethics must itself become globalized" (1). If so, how might this happen? Kymlicka suggests that there are three options. First, a specific, existing tradition might be imposed as the only legitimate perspective from which to view moral questions. Second, there might be an effort to "define an entirely new ethical vocabulary that is not drawn exclusively from one of the historical ethical traditions, but rather is built specifically for the purpose of engaging in cross-cultural debates" (2). Third, we might look to a two-level solution, one in which there is a minimal, self-standing discourse acceptable to all, coupled with a multiplicity of richer second-level traditions that both ground (each in a different way) the first-level discourse, and explain what more is needed, above and beyond the minimal values of level one.

One of the volume's major themes is to consider how well international human rights discourse functions either as the second of these options, or as the first-level discourse in the third option. It can be tricky to distinguish between options two and three; the closest we come to a pure option-two solution is in Daniel Philpott's essay on the international law tradition. Philpott stresses the historical evolution of internationally agreed-upon norms, arguing that the tradition is dedicated to the widening (to more states), deepening (of genuine commitment), and broadening (of the categories and attributes protected) of the coverage of human rights. At the same time, notwithstanding the fact that proponents sometimes seek to justify human rights according to various local frameworks, "no legal norm -- no treaty, no law, no covenant -- explicitly requires such grounding" (17). The challenge for international human rights, Philpott therefore says, is to deal with states that either demur from committing themselves to its norms, or after having committed themselves then come to dissent from the norms.

It is certainly true that the international human rights regime has done significant good in the world, and I agree with those voices in the volume that see it as continuing to play a very important role in the globalization of ethics. Furthermore, whatever its limitations, we may think that one of the most practically effective forums available right now is representatives of states sitting around a table and negotiating a treaty. However, we must be alive to the shortcomings of the free-floating status that Philpott sees for human rights norms. Most basically, we should remember the ancient insight of Confucius: "Lead them with government and regulate them with punishments, and the people will evade … Lead them with virtue and regulate them with ritual, and [the people] will acquire a sense of shame and moreover, be orderly" [Analects 2:3]. In other words, legal norms with no grounding in morality serve us poorly, whether at the domestic or international level. Muhammad Khalid Masud expresses this idea with respect to human rights discourse and Muslim societies when he says, "For the successful application of any idea within a community, it is essential for the people to come to own that idea" (100). He thus urges us to take seriously efforts by Muslims to articulate local understandings of human rights norms, to which I will return below. First, though, note that Philpott's own solution to demurring or dissenting states is "dialogue." He suggests that one kind of dialogue might be between "the international law tradition and cultures that object to some of its provisions" (34), but I have a difficult time imagining what this means. Setting aside legitimate concerns about whether cultures are adequately monolithic to be represented in such a fashion, who represents the international law tradition? In fact Philpott offers a fascinating example of dialogue: over some decades, Catholic resistance to religious freedom and European liberal republican anti-clericalism evolved in tandem, and in ways that largely meet the criteria Philpott suggests for dialogue. He concludes, "it was only once it felt secure in the political participation of Catholics that the Catholic Church was willing to endorse religious freedom and embrace human rights" (37). So the result of the dialogue was broader support for human rights, but the substance of the dialogue involved reciprocally-prompted internal reflections on what really mattered to each side. The evolution of broad-based secular and religious traditions seems to lay the ground for evolution of international human rights norms, even if the language of human rights itself can serve as a catalyst to such processes.

The upshot is that the volume gives us no confidence at all in Kymlicka's second option, and we should turn to consideration of the other two. An important theme in the collection is the exploration of how second-level traditions (the richer, local traditions) might function in a two-level model. I noted a moment ago that Masud argues for the importance of Muslim efforts to make sense of human rights ideas in their own terms. He stresses, though, that two representative "Declarations" outlining Islamic perspectives of human rights -- the texts of which are included at the end of the volume -- are significantly different from one another; one expresses what he calls a "state perspective," while the other offers a "non-state perspective." One thing we might take from this is that when traditions are internally contested, their perspectives on human rights are likely to be contested as well. Masud suggests that the difference between the two perspectives he discusses is more political than religious or hermeneutic, but the general point still stands. Several of the essays emphasize the diversity within the traditions they represent. Masud himself not only recognizes this diversity, but also points out a complementary difficulty that exacerbates the problems for globalizing ethics. He agrees with other scholars that neither of the Declarations he examined was derived from the Islamic tradition by any explicit methodology. Absent such a methodology, it seems that the authors could assert whatever they liked. He concludes:

It is a challenge to define and apply human rights as truly universal principles, and not as an instrument for cultural, political, and economic hegemony of the powerful. For this reason, human rights have to be rooted in universal ethics. (100)

I agree that arriving at a satisfactory methodology for relating specific traditions to global principles is a challenge, but I worry that Masud has over-reacted to this difficulty when he sees our only hope in a universal ethics, since we have already seen that a free-standing global set of values seems like a dubious proposition. Admittedly, Masud does spend a few pages discussing (and critiquing) the inter-religious dialogues that have sought over the last two decades to articulate a "global ethic," but neither Masud nor any other of the volume's authors offers us much confidence in this project. An alternative response to Masud's concern about methodology would be to push those who claim to offer an X perspective on human rights to articulate the methodology they use to derive the perspective from X traditions, and then we can set about assessing the methodologies. The means and goals of such assessment will vary, depending on whether one identifies as a member of tradition X. Most important, perhaps, will be whether the methodology in question is persuasive to self-identified Xs (Muslims or Confucians or Jews, etc.), but outsider perspectives will be relevant, too. If a given methodology seems arbitrary, or blind to the very possibility of learning something from the experiences of other human communities, then outsiders may have difficulty taking the resulting views on global values very seriously. With regard to Muslim thinking about human rights, there already exist some efforts to shoulder the burden of making explicit a methodology that takes seriously both the claims of the tradition and the attractiveness of various human rights norms. One well-known example is Abdullahi An-Na'im's work, which engages deeply with the hermeneutic principles of Islamic jurisprudence in order to articulate a framework within which most internationally-recognized human rights make sense.[1] Whether or not one is convinced, at a very general level An-Na'im's arguments illustrate how one might respond to the challenge Masud has raised.

Masud and several other authors worry about the degree to which purportedly global values are defined in parochial ways and propagated to further the interests of certain powerful groups. In terms of Kymlicka's initial trichotomy of approaches to globalizing values, it is possible to view such worries through the lens of any of the three, but it is most interesting if we ask why efforts to adopt a two-level view might fall prey to such criticism. That is, even if we make efforts to respect local "second-level" traditions as the ultimate ground for our globalized ethics, can things still go wrong? Kymlicka himself provocatively suggests that the ways in which sixteenth-century Spanish conquerors justified their treatment of indigenous people in the Americas might count as a two-level view. He writes:

The position was that coercion was justified, not to impose Catholicism directly, but rather (1) to ensure that indigenous peoples respected universal minimum standards available to all rational beings, and (2) to ensure the conditions for people to freely witness and discuss the merits of the Catholic religion. On the surface, this does not seem vastly different from any number of contemporary views that insist on the twin goals of respect for universal human rights, combined with the freedom to propagate one's views in peaceful dialogue. (6)

How does something that looks like a contemporary two-level view end up endorsing a "crusader mentality"? Kymlicka gives two reasons. First, the account of universal minimum standards was "strangely parochial," based on very little effort to understand or engage with other communities' moral standards. Second, the idea of free discussion of the merits of religion was understood in a fundamentally asymmetrical way: "no one had a reciprocal right to convert Catholics in Spain." While Kymlicka says (perhaps optimistically) that in our post-colonial era everyone is "at pains to repudiate the crusader mentality," he insists that the problems highlighted by the Spanish case have not gone away, since we are still not sure how to set minimal universal standards or how to characterize the appropriate terms of dialogue and debate among local ethical traditions.

Let us see how some of the volume's most explicit two-level views stand up to Kymlicka's challenges. One example is found in Michael Walzer's discussion of two kinds of universalism in Jewish thought, which he characterizes as "high-flying universalism" and "low-flying universalism." In both versions, there is a distinction between the specific, maximal covenant between God and Israel manifested in Torah, and the minimal commands -- the Noahide Code -- that are directed at all the "sons of Noah," which is to say all humanity. This latter code may have had its historical origins in a set of rules for non-Jews living in a Jewish state (43), but its "civic norms" and requirement of equitable adjudication are understood to be applicable to all people, no matter where they live. All Jews are bound by the particularist teachings of Torah. With respect to Noahide values, "high-flying universalists" eschew any "close engagement with the actual terrain of moral and political life" (49). They adopt what Walzer calls a "missionist" stance, seeking to raise the moral level of humanity toward a convergence on a thick set of moral norms that he explicitly relates to the doctrine of human rights. The thick, maximal values that high-flyers seek for everyone are different in key ways from Torah, but they are also significantly different from the existing values of non-Jewish communities. High-flying universalists do not envision using coercion or even active promotion to achieve their goals; rather, Jews are to exemplify the norms. Their role is educational, not actively political.

Low-flying universalism, which Walzer says is more "characteristically Jewish," "acknowledges the actually existing landmarks and demarcations of the social terrain." We are to imagine a low-flying helicopter, perhaps, that must navigate around terrain features in a way that a commercial jet far above need not. There is an acceptance of difference and pluralism in this vision, notwithstanding the idea that all should still, in a minimal way, aspire to "walk in His paths." Walzer is clearest about what this could mean when he writes of the prophet Amos's denial that the Jewish exodus from Egypt was unique. "While there is only one liberator," comments Walzer,

there are many different liberations … : repeated experiences of oppression, liberation, covenant, and moral legislation. Each experience might be different but recognizably similar; the moral codes of the different people would not be the same, but they would overlap in significant ways. (51)

Low-flying universalism is about retaining particularism while simultaneously pointing toward a degree of possible universalism. On a related note, Walzer adds that exilic Jewry often understood the actual laws of gentile nations to be "normative": as implementations of Noahide values, they were not only binding on Jews, but Jews could even learn from the gentiles (45). Walzer acknowledges that this sort of comparison was not often made explicit, but argues that it explains the Jewish renunciation of polygamous marriage around the year 1000. In short, we can see Walzer thinking through two different ways that a two-level approach to globalizing ethics can look from within a Jewish vantage point. Even high-flying Jews are constrained on this account to educational activities, and so they seem safe from Kymlicka's challenge. Walzer's own preference is for the more particularistic low-flyers; from their perspective, universalism is more a matter of analogies or loose-fitting feelings of solidarity (compare, for instance, Walzer's discussion of thin values in Thick and Thin [Notre Dame, 1994]) than of a specific regime of international norms.

Peter Nosco's chapter on Buddhism offers another two-level approach to the globalization of ethics, though his own stance vis-à-vis the tradition is quite different from Walzer's. Walzer is writing, in the first instance, as a Jew for other Jews. Non-Jews may learn things from the ways in which Jews debate and deal with the issues at hand, but as I read him, Walzer's principal task is to articulate certain possibilities from inside the tradition for other insiders. Nosco is a scholar of Buddhism and approaches his task as an observer. He is struck by the appeal (to many, himself included) of the Dalai Lama, and uses this as the fulcrum for his reflections on one way in which Buddhism seems to be successfully negotiating the challenges of globalizing ethics. At the core of his discussion is the idea that Buddhism has and will be successful in what he characterizes as "a competition for ideas" [90] insofar as it "veils" its "devotional theistic traditions" (86) and pushes its metaphysical and psychological doctrines regarding change, emptiness, the problem of attachment and desires, as well as the ethical centrality of compassion. As Nosco sees it, this "reconstituted" Buddhism has already had considerable success in the various dialogues among religions by representing itself as a "non-theistic spiritual complement to monotheism." This is a two-level view in the sense that Buddhists are understood as playing a role in the articulation of a consensus on values that might emerge through global dialogues, while at the same time holding on to richer views for themselves -- behind the veil, as it were. One reason I suggested that Nosco's perspective differs from Walzer is because Nosco does not give us a sense of whether such veiling would feel justified from within the standpoint of a committed Buddhist. It is of course important to keep in mind that many Asian traditions have never been exclusivist in practice, but arguments have often been rampant at the level of theory and orthodoxy.

Let us turn now to traditions that, according to the authors in the volume, are best understood as putting their own values forward as the eventual solution to the challenge of globalizing ethics. We will see that this may involve a considerable acceptance of diversity, but adherents of these traditions either see purportedly global norms like human rights as not merely compatible with their home values, but actually expressions of such values; or else they resist the globalization of human rights in favor of some other sort of global values that are rooted in their local tradition. One instance, according to Richard Madsen, is Confucianism. Madsen offers a crisp and compelling summary of the Confucian tradition's development over many centuries -- which emphasizes its internal diversity -- and summarizes certain themes that can, by and large, be said to characterize Confucian thinking. All of this is extremely well done. With respect to Confucianism in the contemporary world, Madsen notes that many East Asian intellectuals have advocated a wholesale rejection of the Confucian legacy, while others are seeking to develop a "New Confucianism" that values democracy and/or gender equality, often in part by jettisoning the metaphysics of neo-Confucianism. He adds that "Confucianism does not have a well-institutionalized base for influencing the development of a global ethic" (130). In light of all this, the prospects for Confucianism are decidedly mixed, but Madsen nonetheless suggests that

The Confucian approach toward the globalization of ethics would be one of global accommodation of conflicting ethical differences, with the expectation that adherents to other ethical traditions would eventually be persuaded to accept key Confucian values because of their manifest moral superiority. (125)

In short, Confucians are willing to engage in some internal critique and learning from others, but their goal remains a "thick universalism" based on their revised values. A key reason for this, says Madsen, is their resistance to "thin" alternatives like human rights. Based on their valuing rule by virtue over rule by law, he says that even modern Confucians would be "skeptical of the capacity of international laws to create the foundations for global peace," much less "humane respect for individuals' dignity" (129-30).

Madsen's account is true to much of what has happened within Confucianism over the last century, and is also stimulating in a theoretical way: the idea that one can retain thick universalism as a goal, even while engaging in substantial self-critique that is prompted by deep reflection on values that are expressed differently or better in other traditions, is an important model for the globalization of ethics. I do want to complicate Madsen's account somewhat, however. New Confucianism -- the most common way of referring in English to developments in Confucianism since the institutional basis for Confucianism collapsed at the beginning of the twentieth century -- is itself diverse, and some of its leading voices have tried to work out a very different relationship to thin values like human rights than the one Madsen articulates. In particular, Mou Zongsan (1909-1995) argued that the possibility of full realization of Confucian moral ideals (like sagehood) requires that laws and rights come to have an independent status, not overrideable by putative sages.[2] It remains an open question whether these "political" constraints, as he calls them, would have exactly the same contents as currently recognized international human rights. Mou's argument is another instance of the process of internal self-critique that has characterized New Confucianism, even while he would join all New Confucians in insisting that the thick Confucian values resulting from the process of critique are both distinctively Confucian and highly attractive.

One of the most straight-forward examples in the volume of an ethic that simply offers itself as the solution for everyone is the natural law tradition as discussed by Mark Murphy. Based simply in human rationality, its tenets are both authoritative and knowable by all. These ideas will be familiar to most of the volume's readers. What keeps Murphy's chapter from being extremely short are his intriguing answers to two questions: from the perspective of one committed to the truth of a unitary natural law, (1) would convergence of de facto moral systems be a good thing? (2) if so, what steps might be taken to promote such convergence? In fact, it really goes without saying that considerable convergence must be endorsed by any natural law theorist. Murphy argues, though, that "complete convergence" would in fact be a terrible result, and not one that natural law requires. Natural law countenances three sources of variation. First, there is what David Wong calls "environmental relativity," which Murphy explains in this way: "the precepts of natural law surely include in their content provisions the satisfaction of which depend on the local conditions that obtain" (139).[3] Second, natural law allows for some amount of variation in the different ways that local peoples "fill in the gaps" or "make concrete" its vague or high-level provisions. Third, if we accept (as Murphy does) that the goods on which natural law bases its theorizing are irreducible and incommensurable, then further openness will be generated by different and yet acceptable ordering among these goods. So natural law allows for (some) variation. Murphy adds to this that there are reasons for seeing variation as a positive good, and concludes that complete convergence would be "massively unattractive," and ends with some discussion of when intervention might nonetheless be justified. It should be clear from all this that Murphy's approach is very clever, because it provides him with a way to respond implicitly to the most obvious objection to his whole approach, namely that the considerable actual variation among de facto moral systems shows that there is no "natural law" knowable by all. By emphasizing that any natural law theorist both can and should value many sources of diversity, he has shifted the grounds of debate about natural law into the notoriously tricky question of just how much diversity there actually is in the world. In fact Murphy offers valuable lessons to all concerned with the globalization of ethics: the origins of variation among de facto moral systems are many, and many are based not in conflict of fundamental values but in the unproblematic sources Murphy identifies.

Virtually all of the chapters acknowledge disagreement among a given tradition's proponents about issues relating to the globalization of ethics. None are as stark as the difference Max Stackhouse identifies between those Christians who see globalization as "another fall" and those who view it as an instance of "providential grace." Both approaches are best understood in terms of Kymlicka's first category; the key difference is whether they generally endorse the current direction toward which global values are converging. While Stackhouse gives voice to those Christians who are profoundly critical of current international institutions and values, his sympathy clearly lies with those who emphasize that "many of the key elements of the global order such as human rights are either directly related to Biblical insights or can be seen as valid ethical developments from them" (73). He clearly sees a special role for Christians in the process of globalizing values, both historically (though not always intentionally) and into the future: "[the Christian] faith may have taken upon itself the responsibility of forming and informing an emergent global civilization ethically in an intentional way with a new consciousness of its encounters with other religions and cultures" (65). This is a "new form of missions, a mandate for our time to invite all peoples of the world to become participants in a global civil society that is marked by the empowerment of the people" (67). Stackhouse is aware of possible dangers that might result from "misunderstanding" the providential grace view he has outlined. In particular, religion must not become politicized. One source of comfort here is that notwithstanding the ways in which Christianity has aided sundry lords and nationalists, Stackhouse assures us that "its deeper theological impetus" is toward a separation of church and state, a defense of freedom of religion, and guarantees for human rights (68). In light of the worries about the sixteenth-century Spanish efforts towards globalizing ethics with which we began, it is worth asking whether Stackhouse has articulated a strong enough source of restraint. Perhaps because of the dominant and positive (on balance) role he sees Christianity as having played in globalizing ethics so far, Stackhouse is enthusiastic about Christians embracing an ongoing sense of mission. So long as adequate attention is paid to the concrete conditions and contexts in which transcendent principles must be applied, the "crusading moralism that has sometimes marred Christian evangelism" (74) can be restrained, he says. Let us hope so.

I have so far said nothing about the final two main chapters, the valuable discussions of liberalism and feminism by Chris Brown and Kimberly Hutchings, respectively. Both emphasize the diversity of their "traditions" even more than most other chapters, and nicely disentangle the different perspectives from which self-identified liberals or feminists have viewed the idea of globalizing ethics. One recent focus of debate among the former has been the issue of cosmopolitanism, with Rawls's effort to articulate a liberal view short of full cosmopolitanism drawing a great deal of attention (both pro and con). A central issue among feminists has been whether to fully support the project of international human rights: the positive stance of "enlightenment feminists" has been critiqued by "postcolonial feminists," with "care feminists" stressing instead the cultivation of virtues in particularistic ways. Both authors end their contributions with some suggestions of values that all liberals or all feminists share, despite their many differences.

William Sullivan begins his concluding essay by asserting, "The chapters in this volume represent an experiment in dialogue among a group of the ethical traditions that shape the contemporary world" (191). I will bring my review of the volume to a close by asking to what extent this is true: have we seen "dialogue"? And is dialogue, in the end, what we really need in order to deal constructively with the globalization of ethics? In answer to the first question, I would say that the volume may not show us dialogue, but also that a charitable reading of Sullivan's conclusion actually acknowledges this and points us toward something different. A few pages in, Sullivan writes:

Dialogue becomes possible only by learning to see from the other's point of view. It is sustained when the other's point of view becomes something of importance, even a source of possible enrichment of one's own. The contributors have sought to foster dialogue by opening up areas of possible conversation that could produce insight and greater mutual understanding across differences in ways of ethical thinking. (193)

There are few points in the volume where we witness someone writing on behalf of tradition X say, "As we Xs have learned from tradition Y, …" If there were any such moments during actual discussions leading up to the production of the volume, they are not in evidence. Nor do the essays engage one another in critique or suggest possible reinterpretations of others' claims. For all these reasons, I suggest that readers of the volume are not taking in a "dialogue." Nonetheless, it is very much the case that the essays push one to see others' points of view. In the context of globalization's pressing relevance, it is hard to avoid thinking of these perspectives as important, and even as possible sources of enrichment. So perhaps we should say that the volume looks likely to successfully "foster dialogue." Better yet, we might ask that dialogue across traditions be accompanied by dialogue within traditions, and that this latter dialogue should be stimulated by the former. This style of dialogue is tantamount to what I have elsewhere called "rooted global philosophy," and deserves to be more widely accepted as the mode of philosophical discourse (or dialogue) best suited to our contemporary era. Such an approach acknowledges one's rootedness in one or more particular traditions, and yet looks for growth through the stimulus of encounters with other traditions. Methodologically speaking, this process can take place without any assumption that we will all converge on a single point. This process can also help to better underwrite local commitments to thin sets of global values, though such results are once again a contingent matter.[4] The Globalization of Ethics gives us no reason to be overconfident that a thick, sustainable global convergence is in the offing. Then again, the volume gives us some reasons for wondering whether such a result would even be desirable. We can be certain, though, that transnational debates about ethics are unavoidable, and the authors of this outstanding collection of essays are to be thanked for helping us to think further about the directions in which such debates -- both within and between traditions -- should develop.

[1] An-Na'im, Abdullahi Ahmed. Toward An Islamic Revolution: Civil Liberties, Human Rights, and International Law, Syracuse, 1990.

[2] See Mou, Zongsan, Zhengdao yu Zhidao [The Way of Politics and the Way of Administration] (Taipei, 1991). For further discussion of Mou's ideas, see my "Human Rights and Harmony," Human Rights Quarterly 30:1, February 2008.

[3] See Wong, David, Moral Relativity, Berkeley, 1984.

[4] Charles Taylor's important essay "Conditions of an Unforced Consensus on Human Rights" (in Bauer and Bell, eds., The East Asian Challenge for Human Rights, Cambridge, 1999) explores something very much like this.