The Golden Age of Indian Buddhist Philosophy

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Jan Westerhoff, The Golden Age of Indian Buddhist Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2019, 326pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198732662.

Reviewed by Ethan Mills, University of Tennessee at Chattanooga


Jan Westerhoff's book is an ambitious and thorough addition to The Oxford History of Philosophy series. This book, written by an eminent specialist in the field of Buddhist philosophy, serves as an advanced introduction to a fertile period of philosophy as well as a reminder that the history of philosophy cannot merely be identified with the history of Western philosophy. While the book would be accessible to most people with a background in philosophy, it is probably most suitable for those with at least a rudimentary understanding of the basics of early Buddhism.

Westerhoff begins with an introduction and then moves on to the four core chapters on Abhidharma, Madhyamaka, Yogācāra, and the Diṅnāga-Dharmakīrti school respectively. This covers roughly the first millennium CE, the eponymous "Golden Age" of Indian Buddhist philosophy, although he does occasionally discuss later developments in South Asia, Tibet, and East Asia.

Before diving into the content, I should note a few organizational aspects that make this a helpful reference source. Westerhoff's detailed analytical table of contents, diagram of schools and thinkers, and the marginal topic headings printed throughout (similar to those found in many 17th-18th century European books) all make this a volume to which readers can easily return later.

Westerhoff's introduction sets out the philosophical and historical context for the development of Indian Buddhist philosophy, focusing on factors such as the unique role of public debate in ancient India as well as the roles of sacred texts, commentaries, and meditation within the Indian Buddhist tradition. He takes up a "hybrid approach" in his historical methodology:

We will structure the history of Buddhist thought according to traditional and plausible historical sequence Abhidharma -- Madhyamaka -- Yogācāra -- Diṅnāga and Dharmakīrti, while paying attention to their mutual interrelations, and discuss the difficulties in clearly differentiating between them. (p. 10)

Perhaps the most unique aspect of Westerhoff's methodology comes from his desire to balance what he sees as a somewhat anti-realist view about the past among many Buddhist philosophers with contemporary Western assumptions of naturalist historical realism. He suggests striking this balance

by momentarily bracketing some of the naturalist assumptions that we hold. What this means is that when our views of the world conflict with claims that are relevant for developing an account of the history of Buddhism (such as claims about maximal human lifespans, the objective existence of the past, and so on), we temporarily suspend these views in order to find out how far we can go in our analysis without appealing to them. (p. 32)

The first chapter focuses on Abhidharma, a large and diverse family of philosophical schools that aimed to systematize early Buddhist teachings. Here Westerhoff skips earlier Buddhist developments -- the suttas or discourses of the historical Buddha and his early disciples as well as the vinaya or rules for the order of monks and nuns -- so readers entirely unfamiliar with that material might seek out introductions to that material before delving into the rest of Westerhoff's book.[1]

After an overview of some of the common tendencies among Abhidharma schools (there are traditionally said to have been 18 schools), Westerhoff discusses some of the views of five major Abhidharma schools: Mahāsaṃghika, Theravāda, Pudgalavāda, Sarvāstivāda, and Sautrāntika. For instance, he covers the Theravāda Kathāvatthu, a text on debate and logic; the Pudgalavāda view of non-reductionism about persons, which opposes the reductionist view upheld by almost all other Buddhists; and the Sarvāstivāda view that the past, present, and future all exist (hence, their name, sarva asti, or "everything exists"). Westerhoff also discusses possible points of continuity between Abhidharma and later Mahāyāna developments, such as Mahāsaṃghika views on emptiness as related to Madhyamaka, and Vasubandhu's Sautrāntika representationalism, which may be one step removed from Yogācāra views of perception.

The remainder of the chapters focus on schools resulting from, or at least heavily influenced by, the rise of Mahāyāna (literally, "great vehicle"), starting with the Madhyamaka school in Chapter 2. Here Westerhoff does give a brief overview of the history of Mahāyāna and its sacred texts, particularly the Perfection of Wisdom texts, many of which put forward an illusionistic view of reality that influenced the development of Madhyamaka and Yogācāra. Westerhoff begins his treatment of Madhyamaka with a lengthy section on its founder, Nāgārjuna (c. 1st-2nd centuries CE), and his key texts, arguing that major aspects of Nāgārjuna's texts are inspired by the following ideas found in the Perfection of Wisdom texts: "a criticism of the Abhidharma project . . . the doctrine of illusionism, and . . . an explicit acceptance of contradictions" (p. 99). Westerhoff covers topics including Nāgārjuna's arguments concerning time and causation, his defense of a form of illusionism, and his apparent acceptance of contradictions in the tetralemma or catuṣkoṭi (a topic that has generated a lot of contemporary interest, for example, from Graham Priest and Jay Garfield).

Westerhoff moves on to some of Nāgārjuna's important commentators, such as Buddhapālita, Bhāviveka, and Candrakīrti, each of whom presents a somewhat different understanding of Nāgārjuna's goals and methods, particularly on the issue of whether Madhyamaka philosophers should put forward a positive view in a debate context (Bhāviveka) or merely critique the claims of others (Candrakīrti). He ends the chapter with sections on later 8th century CE philosophers, Kamalaśīla and Śāntarakṣita, who were in some sense synthesizing Madhyamaka and Yogācāra, and a section on Madhyamaka's interactions with Nyāya, a non-Buddhist school famous for its defense of realism.

Chapter 3 focuses on Yogācāra. Westerhoff conceptualizes his history of this school in five stages, moving from its beginnings in the Mahāyāna texts (stage 1) and Maitreya (stage 2), though its systematic defense by its founders Asaṅga (stage 3) and Vasubandhu (stage 4) in the 4th or 5th centuries CE, and ending with its development in India afterwards (stage 5). The Vasubandhu section covers the problems of his dates as well as whether the Yogācāra author and the Abhidharma author (considered in Chapter 1) are the same person (Westerhoff sees no reason to deny this).

Westerhoff then moves on to paraphrases of many Yogācāra arguments, including Dharmakīrti's defense of rebirth in opposition to the materialist Cārvāka school, the debate between Dharmakīrti and Ratnakīrti about the existence of other minds, and Vasubandhu's and Ratnakīrti's arguments in favor of radical momentariness. Westerhoff proceeds next to treatments of key Yogācāra terms such as cittamātra (literally, "consciousness-only"), store consciousness, the three natures, reflexive awareness, three turnings of the wheel of doctrine, and tathāgatagarbha (the notion that all creatures possess the potential for Buddhahood). These are all detailed sections; for instance, the section on consciousness-only includes an interesting overview of the scholarly discussion of whether this makes Yogācāra a type of metaphysical idealism (p. 176-179). Westerhoff ends the chapter with some discussion of the textual and meditative context of Yogācāra as well as its relation to other Buddhist schools and to at least one non-Buddhist school, Vedānta, with which it shares surprising similarities through the figure of Gauḍapāda (c. 6th century CE).

Chapter 4 covers the school of Diṅnāga and Dharmakīrti, two philosophers who lived around the 6th and 7th centuries CE and have exerted a tremendous influence on both Buddhist and non-Buddhist philosophy in India and beyond. Westerhoff begins with an overview of the biographical details available to us, noting Diṅnāga's turn toward a focus on epistemology and logic and his follower Dharmakīrti's extensive elaborations of these theories. Westerhoff attributes this epistemological turn to a context in which Buddhist philosophers were increasingly engaged in philosophical exchange with non-Buddhist opponents.

The chapter covers major topics in epistemology (such as Diṅnāga's argument that there are two epistemic instruments: perception and inference), inference (including Diṅnāga's innovations in logic, although not necessarily formal logic as we know it today), metaphysics (including Dharmakīrti's arguments in favor of momentariness and against a creator deity), language (including the key theory of apoha, or exclusion, which is an ingenious method of making sense of language while preserving Buddhist nominalism), scripture, which Westerhoff argues is not merely a blind appeal to authority, and "yogic perception," which he argues is not "a kind of epistemic super-power" (p. 248). The last few sections of the chapter cover the issue of how to classify the school of Diṅnāga and Dharmakīrti vis-à-vis its relation to other Buddhist schools, the school's relation to the non-Buddhist Mīmāṃsā school (an intriguing combination of common-sense realism and Vedic ritualism), and the end of Buddhist philosophy in India. In this last section, Westerhoff discusses two later philosophers, Śāntideva (c. 8th century CE), whose work is both philosophically interesting and can tell us more about the practical context of Buddhist monks at the famous university at Nālandā, and Atiśa (c. 11th century CE), whose travels to Tibet demonstrate "the connection of Indian Buddhist scholastic culture with the world beyond the Indian subcontinent" (p. 280-281).

Westerhoff's book is an impressive achievement. The extensive list of topics I have mentioned in this review are not an exhaustive list. I don't have criticisms of the book per se, but there are three aspects of the book of which readers should be aware. First, as mentioned earlier, this is not the best text for those entirely new to Buddhist philosophy. Westerhoff spends almost no time on early Buddhism, a fact that some readers may find results in an over-emphasis on Mahāyāna at the expense of early Buddhism. Perhaps this is not a major problem as the book is not claiming to cover this earlier period. Second, Westerhoff has a tendency to paraphrase the more technical arguments rather than quoting them directly (in translation). Readers looking for more thorough textual work may be disappointed, although Westerhoff includes extensive citations of such work.

Lastly, the history that Westerhoff writes is not entirely neutral on scholarly matters. This is not a bad thing. One would expect a scholar of Westerhoff's experience to have formed their own views about their subject of study. Yet readers relatively new to the field of Buddhist philosophy should be aware that this book takes place within a specific framework influenced by Westerhoff's previous work. For instance, his early insistence that readers bracket their historical realism may seem odd to some readers, who may wonder either why this is necessary or whether some degree of bracketing is already assumed when one reads historical philosophy, but this move makes more sense if one is aware of Westerhoff's extensive discussions of anti-realism in Buddhist philosophy elsewhere. Likewise, Westerhoff's defense of anti-realist interpretations of Madhyamaka in previous work might color his more ostensibly neutral treatments here, and his obvious preference for idealist readings of particular Yogācāra texts might determine his understanding of the school overall. To be clear, Westerhoff is not evasive about his own leanings (see, for instance, his explicit defense of an idealist reading of Yogācāra on p. 176-179), but readers should be sure to attend to the places where Westerhoff is clear about his own position in order to come to their own conclusions.

Again, none of the previous points should be taken as definitive criticisms. They in no way detract from Westerhoff's thorough, comprehensive treatment of this fascinating chapter in the history of philosophy. In his conclusion Westerhoff recommends "doing philosophy with ancient texts" (p. 284). Readers looking to do some philosophy along with the greatest works of the Golden Age of Indian Buddhist philosophy would do well to take up this volume.

[1] For introductions that include sections on early Buddhism, see Rupert Gethin, The Foundations of Buddhism (New York: Oxford University Press, 1998), Mark Siderits, Buddhism as Philosophy: An Introduction (Indianapolis: Hackett, 2007), and Amber Carpenter, Indian Buddhist Philosophy: Metaphysics as Ethics (New York: Routledge, 2014).