The Golden Age of Phenomenology at the New School for Social Research, 1954-1973

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Lester Embree and Michael D. Barber (eds.), The Golden Age of Phenomenology at the New School for Social Research, 1954-1973, Ohio University Press, 2017, 398pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780821422045.

Reviewed by Eduardo Mendieta, Penn State University


For full disclosure I should state at the outset that I am an alumnus of the New School, although I graduated more than two decades after the period designated in this book's title as the Golden Age of Phenomenology at the New School, at the dawn of what I could call another Golden Age, that of Critical Theory. I also met Lester Embree within the context of the Society for Phenomenological and Existential Philosophy (SPEP), where he would invariably take the floor during business meetings to press a particular issue having to do with phenomenology, or to announce congresses and or meetings of a phenomenological society. I also had the opportunity to work with Michael Barber, in particular when he was writing his book on Enrique Dussel, and his fine translation of one of Dussel's most important books.

There are Festschriften to thinkers, but I have never come across one to a school and cohort. This is thus a sui generis book. It has two parts. The first covers the "Teachers," the second the "Students." Among the teachers we have: Alfred Schutz, Dorion Cairns, Werner Marx, Aron Gurwitsch, J.M. Mohanty, and Thomas M. Seebohm; among the students we have: Maurice Natanson, Thomas Luckmann, Helmut Wagner, Fred Kersten, Richard M. Zaner, Lester Embree, Jorge García-Gómez, Giuseppina C. Moneta, Osborne P. Wiggins, and William McKenna. The "Teachers" section begins with a reminiscence or a biographical sketch of the figure in question, followed by one of their representative or classic pieces. The "Student" begins with a reminiscence of how the person in question made it to the New School, followed by an exemplar of their own scholarship. There are sixteen philosophers covered. As a whole, the book makes a persuasive argument that there was something like a "Golden Age of Phenomenology" at the New School, and that at the base of this accomplishment there was a group of German-Jewish exiles, who had studied with Edmund Husserl and Martin Heidegger. How did the New School become this vortex not only for phenomenology, but also for all kinds of cutting-edge social science?

The New School was funded in 1919 by a group of social democrats, among them Charles Beard, John Dewey, Wesley Clair Mitchell, James Harvey Robinson, and Thorstein Veblen. Other major intellectuals of the early twentieth century, such as Franz Boas, Harold Laski, Bertrand Russell, and Lewis Mumford, were also associated with the school. From its beginning The New School modeled itself along the lines of the German Volkshochschulen that aimed to serve non-traditional students. It fostered open interaction among students and faculty, with classes held during hours that would allow individuals to hold full time jobs. When the Nazis rose to power in 1933, Alvin Johnson was president of the university. Aware of the rising threat against intellectuals and scholars in Germany, he established the "University in Exile." This institutional arrangement made it possible for many of the dismissed professors and researchers to acquire U.S. visas. The New School became a veritable safe haven, but also a transit point, for many of the thousands of refugees to find academic or comparable positions in the United States. The number of scholars is simply staggering. One wonders what Columbia, Yale, Harvard, Stanford did in this respect.

Social Research, the premier scholarly journal published at the New School, has over nine decades become a venue for avant-garde social science, philosophy, cultural criticism, cultural studies, etc. In 2014, the editors celebrated the eighteenth anniversary of the journal, as well as the thirty-eighth anniversary of the Theodore Heuss Chair, established in 1976 by the Federal Republic of Germany. I refer the reader to volume 81, No. 3 (Fall of 2014), for a brief history of the New School, but also for a sweeping overview of the large number of scholars who came to the New School over the last nine decades. I mention the Heuss Chair because after the sixties, at first through annual grants from the Volkswagen Foundation, and then through an endowment from the Federal Republic of Germany, the New School became the de rigueur destination for some of the most prominent West German scholars. This chair consolidated the link between German scholars and U.S. scholars working in the traditions of German post-Kantian and Post-Hegelian philosophy, and of course, post-Weberian social science.

Returning to our book, I would like to highlight some important points. First, as Embree notes, the phenomenologists of this Golden Period considered themselves to be carrying on a specific task, namely the advancement of phenomenology. There was a conscious and avowed commitment to the "method" or "approach" that had been elucidated by Husserl. Second, as German-trained scholars, they brought a distinct pedagogy to their teaching, that of the research seminar. They treated their graduate students as scholars in training. I was not at all surprised to find out that many of the Students had been assigned dissertation topics by their advisers. In some cases, with the added burden that this would help their advisers advance their own research. The Teachers created a community of researchers, in which everyone was contributing in some fashion to the advancement of the phenomenological project. Third, not only were the Students doing research that would contribute to the overall project, in many cases they became the editors of their Teachers' papers. We could speak of a phenomenological family. Fourth, and perhaps it goes without saying, each of these teachers was a unique, powerful, nurturing, but also commanding, mentor. All the reminiscences are filled with warm memories of seminars, lunch conversation, discussions during office hours, and impromptu encounters.

Well-trained philosophers will have read all if not most of those listed among the Teachers. In fact, as an undergraduate at Rutgers University, I had already read Schutz, Luckmann, and Natanson. I remember being totally mesmerized by Peter L. Berger and Thomas Luckmann's The Social Construction of Reality: A Treatise on the Sociology of Knowledge (1967), a book that has not lost any of its brilliance and relevance. As a graduate student, interested in phenomenology and Frankfurt School Critical Theory, one could not circumvent Dorion Cairns, Aron Gurwitsch, and Thomas M. Seebohm. I still use Cairns' 1960 translation of Husserl's Cartesian Mediations after nearly three decades, with its off-white background and green lettering. Now reading some of these classics, I am pleasantly surprised to discover a couple of things, which I think the reader may also find interesting. Let me begin with Schutz, who is surely the pioneer in translating the phenomenological "approach" not simply to the isolated "Cogito" but to the social "I" and the collective "we." I think his engagement with the methods of the social sciences led to an occlusion of his insights into the linguistic constitution of the social world. The whole of the social world is already presupposed, for Schutz, if we start from language. But this means, correlatively, that to begin with language also means to presuppose a world. No language without social world, no social world without language.

Natanson, the most existential phenomenologist of the Golden Boys, was a pleasant rediscovery, as he aimed to do phenomenology through literature, or rather to find phenomenological insights in literature. Barber, in his contribution on Natanson, writes that Natanson thought that "phenomenology [is] philosophy's poetic essence," (184) and then adds: "he recognizes how phenomenology better than any other philosophy functions poetically, as if the parallels between literature and phenomenology that phenomenology itself detects now rebound back on phenomenology itself, as if poetry now clarifies what phenomenology is." (184) I am sure that many who think of phenomenology as a rigorous science will find this characterization misplaced and misleading.

Among the students, I was pleasantly surprised to discover that Luckmann had developed a counter-genealogy of the primacy of the senses. This is interesting because, as is known, Hans Jonas developed a philosophical anthropology based on the hierarchy of the senses. He placed the eye, sight, as the supreme sense because it is the one that gives us the notion of eternity, which then enables the fashioning of ideas (see pages 209-211). Beyond Luckmann, I have to foreground the work of Richard M. Zaner and Osborne P. Wiggins, who for different reasons took their phenomenological toolkits into the medical field. In many ways, along with Jonas, they contributed to the establishment of what today are called the "medical humanities." I have to confess that I had been ignorant of their work until I read them in this wonderful and capacious book. I am glad that I now know about them. This leads me to one small conclusion for the moment, namely that most of the students pursued orthodox academic careers, becoming what Embree sometimes refers to derisively as scholars who just produce "scholarship." Only two of those profiled in this book had a practical impact in fields beyond philosophy and, in fact, contributed to the creation of a new field.

This remark allows me now to call into question a subtext of this volume, one expressed by Embree in the introduction, namely that there is a distinction between doing "research" in phenomenology that is more noble and pure than doing "scholarship." This invidious dichotomy is unsustainable, as is amply demonstrated by the many texts gathered in this volume. Doing phenomenological research for its own sake, can turn into a narcissistic and hermetic undertaking, as when a whole technical language is developed that is impenetrable to all but a few in the know. I would hazard to advance that the Golden Boys had such an impact because in one way or another their work became relevant to other disciplines: sociology, literary theory, psychology, biology, and medicine. On the other hand, attending to emerging challenges, problems, and quandaries of other disciplines inevitably brings about a revision in the way the "approach" and "method" are considered. A phenomenologist who approaches long term solitary confinement, torture, the death penalty by lethal injection (three actually), or human-animal relations, artificial social agents with "AI," and "smart" objects with extended intelligence will have to reconsider some of the solipsistic and narcissistic dimensions of the phenomenological self.

This book ends in 1973. However, it can be argued that the phenomenological tradition continued to be strong and to have profound impact not only within phenomenology, but also across other disciplines. I already mentioned the work of Jonas, who has become one of the most important philosophers of biology and of the new field of genomics. Hannah Arendt should not be neglected. She was thoroughly trained as a phenomenologist, but like Schutz, sought to apply her tools to political science.

I want to close by referring to a very moving autobiographical essay by Jürgen Habermas from 1980, included in the expanded German edition of his Philosophical-Political Profiles, but not in the English translation. The essay is "Alfred Schütz. The Graduate Faculty of the New School for Social Research (1980)." Habermas recounts his first visit to New York, in the winter of 1967-8, to teach at the New School. He speaks of the 'extramuros' character of the school: the old-world feel, the German accents, the apprehension at a Frankfurter visiting what were children of Freiburg, but also the intense vibrancy of New York during the time: the protests and resistance against Vietnam, the civil rights struggles, the counter-culture. Above all, however, the unwavering seriousness with which students and teachers dedicated themselves to their philosophical studies. Habermas, however, does not wax nostalgic. He sets out to elucidate the ways in which Schutz and Arendt had provided the impetus for his own theory of communicative action, of which a foundational pillar is phenomenology. He presents himself as a direct descendent of the great phenomenologists who taught for decades at the New School. Towards the end of the essay, Habermas refers to Jonas' then recently published The Principle of Responsibility (1979), which he had written in German, because had he tried to write it in English, it would have taken double or triple the time. He needed his maternal tongue to express his thoughts. For Habermas, this is a vignette of how German thought and language had to travel a long, arduous, and traumatic voyage to a country of objectivity and linguistic democracy. Habermas concludes by giving his thanks to the New School for 'constituting a most singular place for the reciprocal fecundity and the most intense Germano-Jewish-American assimilation of the spirit.' Indeed, to this day, the New School remains an unparalleled source for the cross-fertilization of German, Jewish, and American thought.