The Grace and the Severity of the Ideal

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Kestenbaum, Victor, The Grace and the Severity of the Ideal, University of Chicago, 2002, 261pp, $20.00 (pbk.), ISBN 0226432165.

Reviewed by Alan Ryan, New College, Oxford


Although John Dewey was a notoriously unstylish writer, he not only enjoyed the striking phrases he borrowed from other writers, poets particularly, but coined a few of his own. By the same token, he resolutely defended the sufficiency of the world of experience, and at the same time kept on observing that it was what happened at the edge of experience that was really fascinating. Conversely, he eschewed ’aggressive atheism,’ but for most of his life remained a mild, but unmistakable atheist. The world did not present itself to us tidily pre-arranged, with its implications for understanding and action plain upon its face; careful and thoughtful attention is needed to elicit the meaning of experience. But, there is no deep mystery at the heart of experience; indeed, there is, in that sense, no ’heart’ to generate the deep mystery.

The tension between Dewey’s rock-solid commitment to naturalism on the one side and the value he set on the illuminations of poetry and the visual arts on the other has provoked a good many commentators, of whom Professor Kestenbaum is the most recent. His book takes its title from a 1906 essay in The Philosophical Review entitled ’Experience and Objective Idealism.’ As he so often did, Dewey in that essay set the struggle between Kantian and post-Kantian idealism on the one side and an inadequate and a more nearly adequate empiricism on the other within a framework that was historical, social, and metaphysical; the reader is essentially asked to contrast the aristocratic, other-worldly philosophy of Plato with the democratic, hands-on, this-worldly critical practice of American radical empiricism.

Although Dewey was not a great stylist, he was a master of a rhetoric that hid its rhetorical devices in plain view. The plain, unpretentious, defense of the sufficiency of everyday practice only rarely descended to the level of accusing critics of simple snobbery, but there was always a suggestion, and sometimes much more than a suggestion, that the aristocratic disdain for manual labour and artisanal skills that permeates Plato’s and Aristotle’s social and political theory still permeates philosophical idealism. The essay culminates in a denunciation of the way ’objective, rationalistic idealism’ promotes ’a total opposition of the given and the ideal, connoting their mutual indifference and incapacity.’ In contrast, an ’empiricism that acknowledges the transitive character of experience … has abundant opportunity to celebrate in productive art, genial morals, and impartial inquiry the grace and the severity of the ideal.’

Whatever one thinks of this as rhetoric, it evidently leaves one large question unanswered. Dewey was passionate in combating philosophical idealism because he resented the accusation that anything other than idealism was incapable of giving a persuasive grounding to the felt experience of encountering a moral imperative, the felt moment of sublimity. Professor Kestenbaum wants to argue two things simultaneously: first, that Dewey’s concern with the margin of experience, with experiences that defy tidy intellectual analysis and raise large questions about the transcendent and God, is a concern that lies at the centre of Dewey’s interests; and second, that Dewey’s own thoughts on these matters repay concentrated rethinking. The nine essays that make up the book are of variable interest and of even more variable accessibility, but Professor Kestenbaum is entirely persuasive of the plausibility of his main themes.

His introductory essay, ’Under Ideal Conditions,’ is a short tour of alternative readings of Dewey, concerned to rebut the old reading of Dewey as an apologist for ‘what Tocqueville called the American “taste for the tangible and the real.”’ [p. 1] It does that, relatively simple, job quite well. But, this is essentially prefatory to what comes next: The second essay is entitled ’The Pragmatic Struggle for the Good,’ and argues rather boldly for a greater continuity between Dewey’s very early forays into ethics and Human Nature and Conduct in 1922, a work that has seemed to many readers to be deeply anti-idealistic. The third essay, ’In the Midst of Effort,’ begins to explore the theme that Dewey’s remarks in 1906 bring to the fore: the ways in which the ideal emerges into the natural world in art. Here, it is Thomas Eakins who is offered, rather convincingly, as a painterly exponent of the pragmatist insight.

The fourth essay, ’Humanism and Vigilance,’ has a more directly educational slant; beginning with the question whether we can restore meaning to the idea of humanism, it has a lot to say about the goals of liberal education, and still more about the need to sharpen our concepts by carefully attending to their ability to catch what it is the experience offers. The fifth, ’The Rationality of Conduct: Dewey and Oakeshott,’ provides a straightforward and useful comparison between Oakeshott’s assault on rationalism in politics and Dewey’s analysis of intelligent action. It is one of the curiosities of the history of ideas that Oakeshott and Dewey shared a deep scepticism about capital-R Reason, and had rather similar ideas about the way in which different fields of inquiry and activity relied on what Oakeshott called ’abridgements’ of experience – and yet came down on quite opposite sides about what modern politics might hope to achieve.

The sixth essay, ’The Undeclared Self,’ is a memorial to William Arrowsmith’s views on higher education that incorporates a nice reminder of one of the very few occasions on which Dewey discussed the education of young people older than eight – a talk on ’A College Course: What Should I expect from It?’ Chapter Seven compares Dewey and Gadamer on meaning, and Chapter Nine employs Dewey and Wallace Stevens to illuminate one another, and to discuss Stevens’s notion of ’the difficult inch’ – a phrase from his poem The Sail of Ulysses: ’the difficult inch, On which the vast arches of space Repose…’ The hinge of the book, however, is the eighth essay, ’Faith and the Unseen,’ where Kestenbaum attempts to defend his claim that Dewey – even in that awkward and somewhat embarrassing book, . Common Faith – was concerned to find room for the transcendental, the sublime, and therefore the divine. On this view, Dewey was not doing what he always said he was doing, namely taking ’God’ as a label, not for some other-worldly entity, but for the totality of his own this-worldly ideals. He was defending a genuinely religious faith.

This, I think, is unsustainable; and it points to a weakness in Professor Kestenbaum’s approach to Dewey. Before explaining what that weakness is, and what it implies, I should say that Professor Kestenbaum starts from the right direction. And since we cannot here chase Professor Kestenbaum through the details of his illustrations, it should be said that, although elucidating Dewey by way of criticising Stanley Cavell’s preference for Wittgenstein involves an awfully long detour, there is everything to be said for elucidating Dewey by reading the right kind of poetry in the company of Art as Experience. Professor Kestenbaum sees clearly that the engrossing feature of Dewey’s writings is not the reminder that if we are to achieve our goals, we need to understand both them and the world in which we hope to achieve them; that is a banality that nobody really denies, even though they may quite sensibly deny that we can thoroughly understand our goals other than in the process of trying to realise them, and equally sensibly deny that we can understand the world in the way we need to understand it except in the process of acting upon it. The intellectually engrossing aspect of Dewey’s writings is the acute tension between his uncompromising naturalism and his insistence that nothing is lost in the richness of human existence – including our moral lives therein – when we adopt that naturalistic stance.

Professor Kestenbaum finds it, perhaps, almost as difficult as Dewey himself to formulate exactly the thought he wants. On the face of it, the notion of the transcendental is exactly the wrong place to begin; it implies just the separation between the ’here’ and the ’beyond’ that Dewey was forever denouncing; and Professor Kestenbaum is plainly friendlier to ’metaphysics’ than Dewey could bring himself to be. Offering a metaphysical account of the transcendental is just what Dewey would not approve of. But it does not seem to be what Professor Kestenbaum really wishes to do, either. Professor Kestenbaum’s allegiances are phenomenological, and his favourite phenomenologist seems to be Merleau-Ponty.

The difficulty we then encounter is one that must strike everyone who wishes not to be an ’aggressive atheist,’ but believes as devoutly as Dewey in the non-existence of a ’beyond.’ What account can we give of the experiences that lead us to invoke the idea of the transcendental: the perception of a meaning in events that is provoked by, but not evidentially grounded in, a factually describable situation; the sudden illumination provided by a line of verse, where we are hard pressed to say quite what has been illuminated and quite how? Dewey was, as Professor Kestenbaum is very good at pointing out, always eager to remind us of what is going on in a situation that lies below or beyond the level of conscious thought; he was insistent on the wealth of unspoken assumptions and taken-for-granted habits of interpretation that we bring to experience. Dewey was also eager to insist that experience is on the side of the view that we find meaning and value in the world, and do not simply impose it.

But none of this quite opens the door to the transcendental. Indeed, on the face of it, Dewey was always more eager to shut the door on the beyond than he was to give a detailed account of how his version of what one might call the beyond within experience could give us all that we really want in our experience. It is tempting to say that Professor Kestenbaum is a frustrating writer in ways that exactly mirror the ways in which Dewey was a frustrating writer; just as Dewey proceeded by negation, attacking bad idealisms without ever quite nailing down what better idealisms might survive his critique, so Professor Kestenbaum proceeds by affirmation, praising good idealisms without ever quite nailing down the ways in which they differ from the worse ones that Dewey deplored. That may, of course, be as much of a compliment as a complaint; it certainly suggests a degree of intellectual empathy that not all of Dewey’s commentators have possessed, including those who think of themselves as his admirers and defenders.