The Greek Praise of Poverty: Origins of Ancient Cynicism

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William D. Desmond, The Greek Praise of Poverty: Origins of Ancient Cynicism, University of Notre Dame Press, 2006, 240pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 0268025827.

Reviewed by Han Baltussen, Institute for Advanced Study/ University of Adelaide


Behind this catchy title lies a wealth of thought-provoking and original analysis which aims at clarifying the central issues of classical Cynicism from its antecedents. 'Cynicism', 'cynics' and 'cynical' are of course familiar enough words, but Desmond is keen to dispel the erroneous meanings they have accrued over the centuries and to go back to the genuine views, which, as he argues persuasively, to this day have lost little of their value. His use of a broad range of sources provides a firm basis for the analysis with a fresh look at familiar passages from Hesiod, Aristophanes, Xenophon, Plato, and Thucidydes (although one reviewer has already pointed out that the selection is still predominantly from the intellectual elite). The overall argument aims to show that Cynics were making use of, or perhaps tapping into, traditional sensibilities and opinions in Greek society regarding wealth and poverty. The Cynics developed a profile that denied wealth an elevated place and instead they sang the praise of poverty. Desmond shows that this position is not new nor completely marginal, but original and of universal appeal across the centuries.

Desmond starts by saying that he wants to brush aside the confusion that he sees among interpretations of the ancient Cynics in which they have become regarded as marginal among Greek schools of thought. This position, which we may label the 'controversial thesis', is combined with a source-analysis that manages to connect the proto-Cynical sentiments with what he considers the central concept of the Cynics: the rejection of wealth. His approach is refreshing in that he proposes to uncover the general Greek ideas on wealth and poverty and how these somehow became the focal point of a small group of social critics typical for a new urban environment. On the follow-up of his thesis I demur, because the fundamental point that Desmond tries to develop, namely that Cynics are not as marginal as has traditionally been claimed, seems to be based on a particular understanding of 'marginal'; but his argument does not show clearly how popular their views may have been. Unless I am misreading him completely, the assumption seems to be that uncovering a broader perception of poverty (how wide-spread this view was remains a question, given the literary sources used) and establishing a link with the Cynic view should mean that they were less marginal. I think this reverses the actual process: popular views were taken up by the Cynics, not vice versa. Desmond should have clarified this concept of marginality, as it seems that the Cynic view on poverty, no matter how close to popular opinion, was in fact still marginal in classical Athens as a result of the methods used for preaching it: for instance, the 'shock therapy' that Diogenes is said to have used (obscenity, paradox, poor hygiene) would effectively marginalize him socially and hence philosophically. There is in addition the question whether we can take all these sources at face value: paying lip service to the praise of poverty is one thing, really believing in it another.

By rejecting the reading of all asceticism as necessarily religious, Desmond paves the way for discussing more appropriate aspects in Cynicism, which he labels "social, military and intellectual asceticism" (19) each of which becomes the central theme of one chapter in the book (chs. 2, 3, and 4 respectively). Thus he maps out his program in accordance with what he sees as the real tenets of Cynicism (self-sufficiency, hard work [in Greek: ponos], and asceticism as major factors in the internalization of values, 30).

Chapter 1 (by far the longest, 27-103) aims to show that a broader definition of wealth and poverty can help to throw light on the connection with popular beliefs by focussing on two paradoxes: (1) poverty is wealth, (2) idleness is work. The procedure is a sensible one: analysis of the terms 'poverty' and 'wealth' in terms of quality and quantity, types of wealth, and views on wealth shows the range of meanings. Desmond homes in on how the Greeks value humans as a major asset of the polis (35). Such judgements already signal that a more internal notion of wealth began to emerge in Classical Greece even though hard work is traditionally seen as the 'primary cause of wealth' (41), and injustice also features in Hesiod's work (Desmond's comment that Hesiod's dichotomy 'looks forward' [42] to Aristotle's discussion of wealth strikes me as unfortunate and potentially misleading). Concurrent phenomena such as leitourgia ('burden of wealth', 55) and luxuries ('benefit of wealth', 61) help complete the picture of widely held views, including chestnuts such as the story of Croesus and Solon (63), to show that philosophical objections to luxury were not just the domain of intellectuals.

The third, and more interesting, notion Desmonds looks at is leisure as a possible benefit of wealth. The traditional view would be that the rich enjoy more leisure. Yet the foregoing arguments on leitourgia and luxuries have shown that these can be a burden as obligation, as a cause for concern (theft), and as distracting elements in one's daily activities. The Cynics would hold that the poor man has more leisure, since he is free from such obligations, possessions and external cares (67).

The work ethic is another important aspect Desmond brings in, making good use of texts which provide a background to the economic situation of the time, as well as to the 'industrious optimism' found from Hesiod onward. Starting from the farmer's limited wealth (and a low expectation to acquire it -- "archaic pessimism", 74) the argument tries to show that wealth was viewed as something out of one's control (Desmond highlights the Greek word for "wealthy", eutuches, which also means "fortunate", 70).

The second paradox concerns the cynics' idleness as a kind of badge of honor: how can one realistically defend the position that "idleness is work"? It links up with the argument about basic needs which are said to be limited and to require only limited work. The provocative formulation of the paradox uses 'idleness' in the traditional absolute sense (absence of work with a hint of laziness) and combines it in the paradoxical phrase equating it to 'work'. Desmond goes on to suggest that the new 'imperialist' work-ethic emerging in Athens brings on an increased need beyond the basic ones, commensurate with the higher stakes and greater ponoi. This imperial optimism he claims is part of the 5th c. rhetoric as exemplified in the Athenian funeral orations (78). One can imagine a certain euphoria is involved here after the unexpected victories over the Persians, but should we take this kind of wishful thinking literally, I wonder? At the same time, Desmond is of course right that Alexander can be seen as an extension of this kind of optimism and as the prime example of insatiable ambitions. Yet we find much speculation (and he knows it; see, e.g., his justification by using "extrapolation" 79).

For Hellenistic times one could then expect philosophical ambitions matching the political ones, if only because the world was 'expanding' and human ambitions with it. The idea of limits and their absence, Desmond suggests, are transferred to ideas about needs for body and soul, finite and infinite respectively. It is clearly Socrates who is presented by Plato as one of the earliest to recommend toil for the soul (cf. Xenophon Memorabilia 2.1.17), playing on the internal / external opposition, making the philosophical life into one of 'toil'. In contrast with the highly intellectual focus of Plato's and Aristotle's philosophies (87-95), the Cynics can be seen to emphasize "work" (ponos) as both physical and mental, in which everything is geared to conquering oneself (instead of Sicily as Athens wanted to, but failed). They claim to be specialists in virtue through asceticism (from askesis meaning "exercise, training, hard work"), which they believe "can overcome everything". The chapter concludes by stating that the Cynics were the synthesizers of the inequalities of the fourth century: hence the emphasis on self-sufficiency which will make us into unassailable strongholds, while dispositions such as povertyand powerlessness (traditionally viewed as weaknesses) can be reconfigured into strengths.

Chapter 3, "Praise of Poverty and War" (105-142), strikes a different note in that it looks more closely at the martial aspect of Cynicism, especially the notion of vulnerability as a strength. Desmond raises the intriguing issue of what he calls the 'martial aspect' of Cynicism, which he claims has been overlooked. This notion ties in with hardship and inventiveness, with potential paradigms in Heracles and Odysseus. He draws useful connections between wealth and honour, virtue and cowardice, from Homer onwards, rightfully charting the changing attitudes to war. The lessons drawn from Marathon and the Persian wars are epitomized, he argues, in Plato's Menexenus, which displays "close attention to historical detail and chronology" (119) and which suggests, as does Herodotus, the ethnic (or: xenophobic) interpretation underlying the contrast of eastern / many / rich / soft versus western / few / poor / tough. Desmond also considers political thought, but here the developmental story he proposes from Herodotus to Xenophon seems somewhat forced and is geared towards showing that all traditional elements re-appear in the Cynic form of 'military asceticism'. At the same time Desmond nicely highlights the militaristic rhetoric and clever puns (in Crates; partly following Dudley) that contribute to the sense of defiance the Cynics display in maintaining their position. But they tailor existing tropes to their own purposes (140) redefining the language of war as metaphorical. Desmond sees Cynic influence in certain speeches (Lysias, Isocrates), one of which advances the view that the Greeks at Chaeronea "died victorious" (141), implying that they remained unassailable (mentally) in not bending to the enemy's will. Such a presentation certainly looks like the Cynic paradoxes, but using a Cynic phrase is of course not always evidence for (in)direct influence.

Chapter 4 (143-167) returns to philosophy and another paradox: "the fool is wise" (143). Taking issue with the common view, Desmond here emphasizes (correctly to a certain extent) the continuity between the Cynics and Greek culture. The paradox may seem un-Greek, but as most paradoxes, it needs unpacking in de-emphasizing the exaggerated contrast and clarifying key terms in context. The intellectual asceticism of the Cynics is reflected in their austere approach to methodology and the core of moral ideology. Here he introduces the interesting notion of the Cynic sage as "the Parmenidean One personified" (145). The Cynics advocate a particular attitude which (as a great number of other Greek concepts) seems to have developed under the long shadow of the Parmenidean notion of the One: "the Cynic unconsciously emulates the attributes of the Eleatic One, and so proclaims his self-sufficiency, consistency, and inner purity from contaminating desires and relations" (146) -- a rather bold, but attractive claim. It is backed up by an interesting analysis of Parmenides' poem (sensibly highlighting its religious dimension). The last part on Socratic poverty and Platonic poverty is interesting for several reasons, but I had trouble seeing how this is connected with the main theme of the book.

The last chapter (169-74) attempts to say something about whether the ideas of the Cynics persisted. The examples of a few intellectuals in later periods such as Epictetus and Marcus Aurelius seem insufficient evidence for building an argument on their wide influence (172). There is a fallacy lurking here, in that Desmond seems to take every rejection of wealth as a sign of Cynicism. This is very hard to prove and he has not done quite enough to get there.

In conclusion this study has much to offer in terms of textual analysis and interpretation, and presents an original investigation into the historical and social antecedents of the Cynic perspective, in particular on poverty, and how it could grow and prosper for a while as a distinct philosophical option. Cynics are defiant characters, responding to Fate and adverse circumstances by training, minimizing basic needs and turning within for strength. Although on occasion the argument meanders somewhat through a great dossier of examples, Desmond has certainly shown convincingly on the basis of good evidence, and often fresh interpretations, how the essential convictions of the (famous) Cynics chime with popular beliefs. One can see how the corollary would be to show that the Cynics somehow have distilled the popular notions into snappy paradoxes and turned them back on society as a moralistic mirror. But Desmond 's attempt to prove his 'controversial thesis' and undo the scholarly assessment of Cynicism as marginal is not quite convincing, since it would seem that with regard to their acceptance (or acceptability) their views were marginal. I suspect this is mainly because few would readily admit to adhering to a transmogrified and much more extreme version of existing views in Cynicism. That their ideas reflect popular views, and that some of their views (in mitigated form I would say) in turn show up in the public sphere again only raises the question to what extent these were still regarded or recognized as Cynical views. Perhaps the characterization in Diogenes Laertius (quoted 144) is a clue (I paraphrase): Cynicism is not a philosophy but a way of life (in itself a kind of paradox in the Greek context where these two notions are not usually placed in opposition). In any case, Desmond's book also shows us that the ancient moral questions regarding tensions between wealth and spirituality are still relevant.