The Happiness Philosophers: The Lives and Works of the Great Utilitarians

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Bart Schultz, The Happiness Philosophers: The Lives and Works of the Great Utilitarians, Princeton University Press, 2017, 437pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691154770.

Reviewed by David Phillips, University of Houston


This book is a collective intellectual biography. Bart Schultz focuses on four central figures in the utilitarian tradition: William Godwin, Jeremy Bentham, John Stuart Mill, and Henry Sidgwick. The book consists of a short introductory chapter, substantial (roughly 50 page) chapters on Godwin and Bentham, very substantial (roughly 100 page) chapters on Mill and Sidgwick, and a short concluding chapter. Schultz is best known for his work on Sidgwick, particularly the monumental intellectual biography Henry Sidgwick: Eye of the Universe. Readers of that book will recognize some familiar themes here, including the Cambridge Apostles, clerisy, colonialism, feminism, and LGBT studies. And they will find, again, that Schultz's affinity for lengthy block quotations and close textual readings allows the voices both of his main subjects and of important figures in the secondary literature to come through very clearly.

Schultz's target audience clearly doesn't consist exclusively of contemporary philosophers. For he begins with caricatures of utilitarianism derived from Dickens, Marx, and Foucault:

The word "utilitarian". . . can all too easily conjure visions of soulless manager drones addicted to "efficient" administration in the least imaginative and most dehumanizing sense. (1)

The book aims in part to respond to this concern:

One thought behind this assemblage of biographical/philosophical sketches is that an introduction to the actual personalities behind utilitarianism might help challenge the dismissive caricatures . . . The great classical utilitarians were fascinating people, brilliant and complex, and as intrinsically interesting as great artists. (4)

Given that this is one element of the project, one might ask why Schultz picks just the four thinkers he does. If his subjects were only Bentham, J.S. Mill, and Sidgwick, the question might not really arise: at this point, that's the standard short list of classical utilitarians. But if you are expanding the list, there are lots of ways to go. Edward Albee's History of English Utilitarianism published in 1902 has chapters, inter alia, on Cumberland, Hume, Hartley, Abraham Tucker, Paley, and Herbert Spencer (as well as multiple chapters on both J.S. Mill and Sidgwick). It has no chapter on Godwin. Adding just Godwin to the standard list, as Schultz does, might invite the suspicion that he is biasing the case against the Dickensian caricature by selectively focusing on politically progressive and personally fascinating utilitarians.

In any case, contemporary students and teachers of philosophy are unlikely to be much exercised by Mr. Gradgrind. They are far more likely to worry that utilitarianism can justify punishing the innocent, or is too demanding, or fails to take seriously enough the distinction between persons. One central question is how much this volume has to tell them about the merits and demerits of utilitarianism. Schultz at times suggests that philosophical biography is an alternative (maybe a superior alternative) to standard philosophical argument:

Although far too many contemporary academic philosophers take an excessively narrow approach, focusing solely on writings rather than persons and dismissing as ad hominem argument a central element of much of the philosophical tradition, there are always powerful critics around ready to challenge that prejudice . . . Current academic opinion on what is or is not "philosophy" might be more reflective of the institutional imperatives and limits of academe than of the larger historical practices of philosophy. This book reflects the belief that one needs the works and the lives, the words and the deeds, in order fully to harvest the contributions of the great philosophers (4-5, italics in original)

I do not find this line of thought as exemplified here persuasive. When Schultz writes about standard philosophical criticisms of the utilitarianism of Bentham, Mill, and Sidgwick, he typically draws on and summarizes (very nicely) the work of contemporary academic philosophers. The problem with the utilitarians to which he devotes much more attention than standard philosophical treatments is their attitudes to colonialism (on which Bentham does strikingly well, Mill much less so, Sidgwick perhaps in the middle). But if the problem is supposed to be that J.S. Mill, as a matter of biographical fact, was insufficiently critical of imperialism and colonialism, it is surely all too easy to argue that this is not a problem with utilitarianism but with Mill himself. Utilitarianism as a first principle can only be applied if it is supplemented with empirical facts. Get those wrong and you will get the wrong results, but that's no problem for the theory. And Schultz's proposed alternative form of argument looks equally unconvincing if we imagine applying it to later phases in the tradition of British moral philosophy of which Bentham, Mill and Sidgwick are parts. Are we, for instance, supposed to decide whether Moore or Ross is right about consequentialism by biographical evaluation, or by examining their political attitudes?

A more modest, and to my mind more appropriate, ambition for a book like Schultz's is suggested by Ray Monk in the Preface to his biography of Russell:

The question for a biographer is not whether a writer's work can be understood in isolation from his or her life (of course it can, as Shakespeare's work amply demonstrates), but rather whether the life can be understood in ignorance of the work . . . The point of a biography is no more and no less than to understand its subject . . . Where that person is a writer . . . the question arises whether he or she can possibly be understood without some attempt to master their work. I think the answer to this is, in general, 'no' (xviii)

If this is the ambition, Schultz's book succeeds admirably; the reader comes away with an enriched appreciation of Godwin, Bentham, Mill and Sidgwick as human beings, and of them and their philosophical projects as parts of 18th and 19th century history.

There is much of biographical, historical and philosophical interest in the chapters on Bentham, Mill, and Sidgwick (on which I will now focus). Begin with the chapter on Bentham. Interestingly, the main foil is John Stuart Mill. Schultz suggests that filial loyalty led Mill to excessively negative verdicts on Bentham (as a way of displacing such verdicts from their proper target, his father James Mill). As Schultz introduces the charges Mill articulated:

Bentham was no philosopher, and he was the great anti-Romantic, lacking in the most crucial ingredient of the Romantic outlook, imagination. And human sympathy, self-consciousness, and a great deal else besides. (54)

Schultz does a good deal to defend Bentham against the charge that he was the great anti-Romantic, arguing inter alia for his imaginativeness and psychological sophistication and for the complexity of his conception of pleasure and pain. But he does much less to defend him against the charge that he was no philosopher. As Mill articulates that charge in his "Remarks on Bentham's Philosophy":

Mr. Bentham does not appear to have entered very deeply into the metaphysical grounds of [his] doctrines . . . The principle of utility . . . stands no otherwise demonstrated in his writings than by an enumeration of the phrases of a different description which have been commonly employed to denote the rule of life, and the rejection of them all, as having no intelligible meaning, farther than they may involve a tacit reference to considerations of utility . . . This, however, is not fair treatment of the believers in other moral principles than that of utility . . . To pass judgment on these doctrines belongs to a profounder and subtler metaphysics than Mr. Bentham possessed . . . The greatest of Mr. Bentham's defects, his insufficient knowledge and appreciation of the thoughts of other men, shows itself constantly in his grappling with some delusive shadow of an adversary's opinions, and leaving the actual substance unharmed. (256-257)

Schultz does deny that Bentham confused psychological with ethical hedonism or committed the naturalistic fallacy. But, of course, those are not the criticisms Mill made of Bentham. Otherwise, for all that Schultz says here, the charge that Bentham was no philosopher sticks. Or, more charitably and in a more modern idiom, Bentham emerges as the first great utilitarian applied ethicist, particularly noteworthy for his strikingly advanced views on colonialism and sexual morality, but not much cop at ethical theory or metaethics.

Mill, of course, has been subject to at least as much vituperative philosophical criticism as Bentham. Insofar as Schultz himself introduces a standard charge sheet against Mill, its central complaint is inconsistency: Mill's views are "a jumble of pure utilitarianism with liberalism, perfectionism, egoism, etc." (115).

The chapter begins with an account of Mill's famous education, along with his equally famous mental crisis and the role of the romantics in his escape from it. There is then a section mostly about A System of Logic with a nice treatment of Mill versus Whewell. Schultz then turns to Mill's relationship with Harriet Taylor, and an assessment of the extent of her contribution, beginning with Principles of Political Economy. Schultz emphasizes her role in pushing Mill in socialist directions. This is followed by a section mostly devoted to On Liberty and The Subjection of Women. Close to the end of this section, Schultz summarizes the views at which the Mills arrived:

These striking calls for freedom of thought, complete equality for women, and ever-increasing economic equality were, to the Mills, but the spelling out of the practical import of utilitarianism in its effort to advance human happiness against the forces of religious traditionalism (bolstered by Intuitionism), mediocrity, and conformity. And plausibly, the best case for utilitarianism is precisely this -- its role, however rough and ready, in defining the direction of progress. (181)

There follows a section entitled "Critics." Here Schultz summarizes, quite briefly, some of the standard criticisms of the argument of Mill's Utilitarianism; in rebutting them, he relies largely on West, Skorupski, Crisp and Sturgeon. Even given the brevity of the section, the supposed move from "desired" to "desirable" in the 'proof' gets surprisingly little attention, given that it is the locus classicus for the question whether Mill articulates a defensible form of ethical naturalism. Schultz devotes considerably more attention to the question of whether Mill is a hedonist or a perfectionist, quoting at length from Brink and Skorupski and concluding that there is something to be said on both sides. He then suggests that nothing discussed in this section is the major problem in Mill's philosophical position. Instead, the final section of the Chapter suggests, the main problem is Mill's sympathy for colonialism. As I said above, on this matter I am unpersuaded.

Since Schultz has already written at great length about Sidgwick, readers of Eye of the Universe might wonder how much novelty to expect in the Sidgwick chapter. Naturally there is a good deal that is familiar. But there is also some striking new biographical and historical material, particularly of two sorts. First, Schultz tells us considerably more than in the earlier book about the extended family from which Sidgwick came and the roles of members of that extended family in the cotton business and in church building. Second, we learn about the bizarre post-Sidgwick preoccupations of the Society for Psychical Research, including "an Other Worldly Eugenics scheme to give birth to a new Messiah who would bring peace to the world (and of course lay to rest the dualism of practical reason)" (288).

On more narrowly philosophical matters, a good deal has been published on Sidgwick since Eye of the Universe appeared in 2004. Schultz gives a nice account of much of this new literature, though, to my mind, while he duly notices a significant strand in this literature that draws on Ross to uncover problems for Sidgwick, he doesn't fully appreciate the force of these problems. As in the chapters on Bentham and Mill, Schultz is preoccupied with philosophical questions about hedonism much more than with philosophical questions about consequentialism or metaethics.

There is also a noteworthy line of thought, present in the earlier book too, which Schultz deploys in connection with the interpretation of the dualism of practical reason. Very roughly, some interpreters have taken at face value most of Sidgwick's words in the places where he explicitly discusses the dualism, and regarded the dualism as a contradiction. Others have for various reasons argued that Sidgwick does think (or ought to have thought) something rather different: that the dualism does not properly involve a contradiction but instead contrasting but compatible agent-relative and agent-neutral reasons. Schultz argues, in effect, in favor of the idea that the dualism has to turn out to be a contradiction, because the dualism is really the expression in Sidgwick's philosophical work of a more general 19th century cosmic pessimism brought on by the loss of religious faith. This might be a point at which biographical work could play a distinctive philosophical role, even if Schultz's grander ambitions for philosophical biography are misconceived. On the whole, though, I am still inclined to the view that the interpretation of Sidgwick's philosophical texts is a matter primarily of the ideas and arguments in those texts and the quality of those arguments, rather than of independent biographical data.

To assess the overall philosophical caliber of Schultz's book, it matters what comparison class one has in mind. One kind of comparison class would include another recent work that puts Sidgwick in a larger historical context: Thomas Hurka's British Ethical Theorists from Sidgwick to Ewing. I think philosophers will learn more about the merits of Sidgwick's case for utilitarianism, and of the case for utilitarianism more generally, from Hurka's book than they will from Schultz's. Hurka's book has a more narrowly philosophical focus; it helpfully treats Sidgwick together with other philosophers who, though they basically shared his metaethical views, were not utilitarians; and it draws on Hurka's own major contributions to ethical theory. If Hurka's book is in the comparison class, Schultz's treatment of the philosophical issues comes off second best. On the other hand, if the comparison class includes only histories or intellectual biographies or intellectual biographies of philosophers, Schultz's book rates very high. He pretty much always manages to convey a clear sense both of the larger issues and the key details. Most of those who care about these issues will of course find that they disagree with him at various points, but they won't think that's because he lacks a proper sense of the contours of the debates.

I keep philosophy books in my office at work, and history books and biographies in my study at home. Hurka's book unquestionably belongs in the office. I plan to keep The Happiness Philosophers in my study. By Schultz's lights, I probably thereby show myself to have an excessively narrow, academic conception of philosophy. I think Schultz has made an admirable contribution to a genre including, inter alia, Manfred Kuehn's biography of Kant, Ray Monk's volumes on Russell and Wittgenstein, Tom Regan's Bloomsbury's Prophet, and Ben Rogers's life of Ayer; but I don't think that Schultz succeeds in showing that intellectual biographies of philosophers are a substitute for philosophical argument.



Albee, Edward. (1902). A History of English Utilitarianism. MacMillan.

Hurka, Thomas. (2014). British Ethical Theorists from Sidgwick to Ewing. Oxford University Press.

Kuehn, Manfred. (2001). Kant: A Biography. Cambridge University Press.

Mill, J.S. (2003). Remarks on Bentham's Philosophy. In J. Troyer (ed.), The Classical Utilitarians. Hackett.

Monk, Ray. (1990). Ludwig Wittgenstein: the Duty of Genius. The Free Press.

Monk, Ray. (1996). Bertrand Russell: the Spirit of Solitude. The Free Press.

Monk, Ray. (2000). Bertrand Russell: the Ghost of Madness. The Free Press.

Regan, Tom. (1986). Bloomsbury's Prophet: G.E. Moore and the Development of His Moral Philosophy. Temple University Press.

Rogers, Ben. (1999). A.J. Ayer: A Life. Grove Press.

Schultz, Bart. (2004). Henry Sidgwick: Eye of the Universe. Cambridge University Press.