The Illusion of Doubt

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Genia Schönbaumsfeld, The Illusion of Doubt, Oxford University Press, 2016, 177 pp., $ 60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198783947.

Reviewed by Peter Baumann, Swarthmore College


Genia Schönbaumsfeld's original and engaging book discusses epistemic skepticism, the claim that we cannot know anything about the external world (including its existence). More precisely, she discusses and raises serious doubts about "Cartesian" skepticism which is currently the most discussed form of epistemic skepticism (though not quite what Descartes might have had in mind). Other forms of epistemic skepticism (Agrippa's Trilemma, skepticism about induction, skepticism without radical scenarios like the recently much discussed lottery-skepticism, etc.) are not discussed. I will use the short term "skepticism" for the view under discussion here.


The main culprit in Schönbaumsfeld's cases against skepticism is a "Cartesian picture" of evidence which says, roughly, the following. In the "bad" case (for instance, when we're merely dreaming that we're seated on a chair, being deceived by an evil demon, reduced to a brain in a vat suffering from an illusion of being seated on a chair, etc.), we have the same evidence as in the "good" case (when we're not in any such skeptical scenario and noticing, truly, that we're seated on a chair). This evidence consists in experiences which are disconnected from the world they're about (2-3) and doesn't entail anything about the external world. We are separated from the world by a "veil of appearances" (sec. 2.III). Knowledge about the external world is thus based on a non-deductive, shaky inference from appearances (3-4). Schönbaumsfeld calls this view the "reasons identity thesis (RIT)" or the "default view" of perceptual reasons.


There is a long history behind such a diagnosis and critique (remember, e.g., Reid against Hume). Schönbaumsfeld, however, gives this traditional idea a contemporary twist. In her first chapter, she discusses it in connection with closure-based skeptical arguments. Here is an example illustrating the general template of such arguments:


(1) If I know that I am now seated on a chair, then I know that I am not a brain in a vat (far away from any chair)

(2) I don't know that I'm not such a brain in a vat

(C) Hence, I don't know that I am now seated on a chair


One can, of course, repeat this kind of argument for all ordinary propositions about the world we take ourselves to know (that I have hands, that there is another person in the room now, etc.). General skepticism concerning knowledge about the world follows. This argument is closure-based insofar as (1) is based on the principle of closure under known entailment which, very roughly, says that


if S knows that p and also knows that p entails q, then S knows that q.

(Schönbaumsfeld gives a more refined version, but this doesn't matter here).


Given knowledge of the relevant entailment (if I am seated on a chair, then I am not an unseated brain in a vat), the closure principle leads to (1). Some, like Dretske (or Nozick) have tried to avoid the above skeptical conclusion by denying an unrestricted closure principle like the one above.

Schönbaumsfeld objects that closure is not the problem and doesn't really contribute anything to the skeptical result. It is rather anterior commitment to the default view that leads to skepticism (8-9, 17): the reasons in the good and in the bad case are the same and insufficient to support any knowledge claim (12), like the claim that one is seated on a chair. All one could then claim is that one has experiences as of being seated on a chair -- which are compatible with both good and bad cases. Hence, one would already be a skeptic from the start. But then the closure-based argument turns out to be redundant and not needed (18-19).


In addition, Schönbaumsfeld thinks that, with the default view, (1) has to be replaced by the false


(1*) If I know that I have the experience that I am now seated on a chair, then I know that I am not a brain in a vat.


The closure-based argument would thus collapse (19-21, 23-24). However, I don't see how the default view would commit one to (1*).


One might also wonder here why anyone should think that experiences as of being seated are not sufficient for knowledge that one is being seated? If this is -- as is somewhat plausible - because one would, for knowledge, have to be able to rule out that one is in a bad case but cannot do that, then this looks very much like the use of a closure-based argument (or something similar, like an underdetermination argument, see 48-53). But if that's the case, then the closure-based argument is at work after all.


There are more important worries. Schönbaumsfeld presents a (disjunctivist) alternative to the default view: in the good case, one has a reason which is factive and "entails" the relevant fact (that I'm seated), while in the bad case one merely appears to have such a reason. There is a difference of reasons after all. The default view is false and one can know both the ordinary proposition (that I am seated; that there is a real cookie on the plate) and the denial of the skeptical proposition (that I'm not a brain in a vat; that there is a fake cookie) (13-15, 21, 23-25, 36-39, 53). No good reason to be a skeptic.


Schönbaumsfeld doesn't give independent reasons in favor of a factive view of evidence or reasons. Williamson, Littlejohn and others have recently defended such a view in great detail but she doesn't go into this at all. One might also wonder whether she would go as far as, e.g., Williamson and identify evidence and knowledge (if not, why not? because it would seem question-begging here?)


But here is a still more important point of contention. Even if Schönbaumsfeld is right about the factive view of reasons, one can still run a closure-based argument for skepticism. Someone like Schönbaumsfeld's Dretske could argue, against her (see 27, 52), that one can know the ordinary proposition without knowing the denial of the skeptical proposition. The epistemic position (e.g., evidential situation) required for knowing that there is a zebra in front of me is different from the epistemic position required for knowing that it's not a cleverly disguised mule. Hence, Dretske would still have reason, even given a factive account of reasons, to deny the (simple) closure principle. (On p. 27, Schönbaumsfeld seems to acknowledge as much as this when she says that one could have evidence that one is seeing Publius, but not that one is not seeing some duplicate.) What matters here is not so much, as Schönbaumsfeld seems to think, whether the evidence is or isn't the same between the good and the bad case, but rather whether the evidence one needs in order to know that p is the same as the evidence one needs to know that q. And this doesn't seem to be the case. I might have good evidence that there is someone in the attic (I am hearing steps) while lacking good evidence that if there is nobody in the attic, then there is someone in the garden shed (which I can infer via disjunction introduction). Closure remains an issue after all.


The second chapter attacks the "aggregate argument" (29) for skepticism: the illegitimate move from the "local" skeptical scenario (that it is sometimes or even always possible to be mistaken) to a "global," radical skeptical scenario (that it is possible that one is always mistaken). This is a kind of argument which Descartes, for instance, briefly mentions and quickly dismisses at the beginning of his First Meditation. That I might be dreaming right now raises, as Descartes also knew, a very different skeptical possibility than that everything might be a dream or a constant deception manufactured by an evil demon. It is not clear to me who ever seriously proposed this kind of skeptical argument.


Schönbaumsfeld objects to the aggregate argument that detecting some error presupposes that one is not always wrong (31). This might be correct, but doesn't do much here because one can, of course, be wrong without being able to detect it (but see 32, fn.3). Schönbaumsfeld goes on to a stronger claim which doesn't follow from the former one: that the possibility of error presupposes that one isn't always wrong (32). I fail to see why exactly this should be so. Is it because skeptics could only make a convincing argument from error if they could claim to know that we're sometimes mistaken and would thus have to know at least that? Also, one wonders what a Pyrrhonian would reply to all this.


But suppose that one cannot always be mistaken. Schönbaumsfeld thinks that this would be sufficient to disable skepticism: only local doubt remains possible, and such local doubt can be disabled using other things one knows (43). Doubts that I am really seeing a zebra and not a cleverly disguised mule can be answered using the knowledge that a zoo like this doesn't do tricks like this. Perhaps - but one would worry that this doesn't work in all cases. I would claim that I am now alone in a room, but what if I've just fallen asleep and am merely dreaming this? I cannot rule this out using other knowledge I have. This is the local and very powerful dreaming scenario which is, again, different from the global scenario in which everything is an illusion. Or do I know that there is a pear in front of me and not a wax imitation? I might not be able to rule out the latter using other knowledge I have. So, the local doubt remains very forceful. One can even argue that local skepticism is more of a threat than global skepticism because it doesn't involve farfetched skeptical scenarios (people really do fall asleep, there really are fake pears in some hotels, etc.; or think of "lottery-skepticism": I seem to know I'll never be very rich, but I don't know I won't win the big fat lottery in Spain).


Schönbaumsfeld thus has little to offer against local skepticism. She briefly mentions that I might be envatted, but points out that, as long as I lack a positive reason to think that I am, I am still entitled to dismiss this possibility (32-33). She does not, however, develop any view of default justification here. If one goes with Austin (as I would) and says that one cannot, but also need not, rule out such local skeptical possibilities because "enough is enough," then one has to deal with closure again.


Having presented direct anti-skeptical arguments in the first two chapters, Schönbaumsfeld goes on to present more diagnostic arguments to the effect that global or radical skepticism (on which she is focusing) cannot even be coherently formulated. The third, long (and here and there slightly tangential) chapter attacks the idea that we could have the experiences we have no matter whether there was a world corresponding to our experiences or not. She argues that this would require the possibility of a private language about experiences that even a brain in a vat could have. Using Wittgensteinian arguments, she finds that this is not possible. Hence, the global skeptical scenario (which, again, I think is not the most threatening skeptical scenario) is not possible. One wonders whether one couldn't still have private thoughts without having a private language? I suspect Schönbaumsfeld would answer this à la Wittgenstein, but she doesn't go into this at all.


I cannot go very much into the very complex discussion of the famous or notorious private language argument here (is there one? Just one?). In this and the following chapter, Schönbaumsfeld engages very much with questions or exegesis and interpretation of Wittgenstein, and not so much with a critical discussion of the pros and cons of arguments offered (not untypical for some Wittgensteinians). I will only discuss a few core points.


Schönbaumsfeld is, I think, right in rejecting one Wittgensteinian (or interpreters') line, according to which there is no criterion of correctness and no difference between correctness and apparent correctness in a private language (66-68). The same problem can be raised for public languages -- which disables this kind of argument (apart from this, this argument seems to involve some problematic verificationism). Schönbaumsfeld is also right in her critique of Kripke's "skeptical solution" to the more general problem of rule-following (68-71). However, she (like Baker and Hacker, and others) misinterprets Kripke as holding the mistaken view that there is a gap between a rule (or its linguistic expression) and its application, so that the rule (or its expression) requires an interpretation (which then starts a regress of interpretations) (71-76, 83). Kripke's problem about rule-following in general is rather the very different, and more basic, one that there seems to be nothing that determines in the first place what the rule is that one is following. Mere reference to a social practice (71-75) doesn't help as an answer here.


But back to the specific problem about a private sensation language. Schönbaumsfeld claims (following her interpretation of Wittgenstein) that it would not be possible to establish the "private" semantic connection between word and object in the first place (83-84). An ostensive definition requires that it is already determined what kind of thing the definiendum is supposed to refer to (is "red" about the color or the shape, etc.?). And this requires a given background of socio-linguistic practices (84-88). One really wonders, here, how the word-object connection is established in the public case. If it is good enough to give the vague and general Wittgensteinian "practice"-answer here, then why not also in the case of a private language? Why rule out individual practices from the start? I think more arguments are needed here (Schönbaumsfeld doesn't even touch on views according to which there are private languages). The argument offered here also reminds one a bit of Putnam (whom Schönbaumsfeld doesn't discuss on this): sensation words have meaning; if they have meaning, then they are not (and cannot be) part of an alleged private language; hence, there is no (and cannot be a) private sensation language.


The fourth chapter is also very Wittgensteinian in style. It argues against the idea of a global assessment of our epistemic situation - of a "global validation" or "indictment" of our knowledge claims. Schönbaumsfeld uses Wittgenstein's ideas (this time from On Certainty rather than the Philosophical Investigations) to show that no global doubt, but only local doubt, is possible. If it is possible to doubt one thing, then many other things have to be exempt from doubt. The propositions exempt from doubt are the "hinge propositions" (107-108). They cannot be doubted and thus also cannot be known (108) because knowledge requires the possibility of error and doubt (109-110). This gives Schönbaumsfeld an occasion to give Moore's proof of the external world short shrift (110-116). She adds a brief semantic point (113-114): that our words would not have meaning if everything could be doubted (an idea that would deserve to be explored much more).


I think that Schönbaumsfeld (and Wittgenstein) are right about ordinary doubt, but I also think they have not shown that there couldn't also be philosophical doubt (as described in great detail by Stroud and others). There is a great danger (on all sides) of begging the question here. Also, that knowledge requires the possibility of error, as well of doubt, seems to require more argumentative support than given here. Can I really not know that I am here now? Apart from all that: isn't Wittgenstein himself pointing out that what is a hinge and what isn't can change from situation to situation (Schönbaumsfeld very briefly mentions OC 97 on 128)? Are Wittgensteinians really getting the semantic facts about "doubt" right or are they rather (ironically) in danger of changing the meanings of common words in the service of some theory?


There is another problem with the claim that hinge propositions cannot be known. Schönbaumsfeld addresses it in sec. 4.IV: it seems incompatible with closure (to which she adheres). Suppose I know that there is a watch and no cell phone on the table. I also know that this entails that there is an external world. But the latter would constitute an unknowable hinge proposition. Schönbaumsfeld proposes this way out: in a skeptical context, "I know I have hands" just means "I know I am not a victim of a radical skeptical argument;" therefore, the skeptical closure-based argument collapses into triviality (125-126). On the face of it, this claim is very implausible: is there really only one anti-skeptical knowledge claim one can make in skeptical contexts, instead of the many ordinary knowledge claims? Why? And what are good reasons to think that, as one makes the relevant inference to the anti-skeptical proposition, the context (radically) changes the content of the formerly ordinary proposition (126, fn.27)? One would like to see more argument here.


The final, fifth chapter proposes to characterize our main "culprit," the default view, as the "fourth" and "final" dogma of empiricism (130). It proposes a "realism without empiricism" (in that sense of "empiricism"). This realism avoids the extremes of epistemic relativism (there is just difference of meaning, not of opinion, in the relevant cases of apparent deep disagreement: 134-136, 142, 149) and of hyper-realism (sec.5.II) (according to which reality "forces" our concepts on us: 137-138, 142-143). I won't say much more about this chapter, also because it appears to be a bit of an attachment to the main claims and arguments of the book. I should only briefly mention that Schönbaumsfeld does not mention or even go into many of the recent debates on relativism (nothing, for instance, on Kuhn here, or on recent debates about truth-relativism).


Overall, I think doubts remain that closure is irrelevant to skepticism (ch.1), that local doubt does not pose a skeptical threat (ch.2), or that the Wittgensteinian responses to global skepticism are convincing (chs.3-4). One can very well have doubts about skepticism, but Schönbaumsfeld's critique doesn't seem to take the life out of it. However, even if all the objections made above go through, this is still a clearly written and original, engaging as well as thought-provoking contribution to the discussion of skepticism. One of its biggest merits is its push towards doubt about skepticism. It will trigger some stimulating debates. Everyone interested in skepticism should read it.