The Immorality of Punishment

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Michael J. Zimmerman, The Immorality of Punishment, Broadview Press, 2011, 183pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781554810550.

Reviewed by Stephen Kershnar, SUNY Fredonia


In his book, The Immorality of Punishment, Michael J. Zimmerman argues that acts of punishment, as well as the practices and institutions of punishment, are overall morally wrong. A practice is a series of act of the same type. An institution is a practice plus other activities that undergird the practice. (35-36) He argues for this thesis by attacking the two ways in which people attempt to justify punishment: crime prevention and retributivism. The book is cleanly written, nicely organized, and has a powerful central argument. It is an important book on punishment by a philosopher who has done breakthrough work on one of the ideas underlying his attack on retributivism. I will criticize it below, but this is done in the context of admiration for both the book and author.

In chapter one, before attacking the justifications, Zimmerman sets out the background to the argument by providing a conceptual analysis of punishment. He argues for the following account. One person engages in the legal punishment of another if and only if the former acts on behalf of the state in such a way that (1) he harms the punishee, (2) this harm is intended by the state, (3) this harm is intended by the state to be fitting -- in particular, to be fitting to the (presumed) fact, perhaps in conjunction with other facts, that the punishee is associated in some way with some offence, (4) he thereby expresses the state's disapproval both of the offence and of the offender in light of the offence, and (5) he thereby acts in some legally official capacity.

In Chapter Two, Zimmerman attacks the notion that punishment is justified because it prevents crime. He argues that this prevention might be thought to occur through rehabilitation, incapacitation, or deterrence, and that these goals do not justify punishment. Zimmerman argues that there is little reason to believe that punishment is an effective means of rehabilitating offenders. He notes that it might be an effective means of incapacitating or deterring them, but argues that non-punitive means need be no less effective. In addition, he argues, it is not easy to specify the conditions under which punishment is effective in bringing about these effects. Zimmerman further argues that these purported justifications are not sufficient to justify punishment because they do not justify punishing the innocent even when doing so would incapacitate or deter potential offenders. Hence, he concludes, we must consider moral and legal guilt.

In Chapter Three, Zimmerman attacks the retributivist notion that legal punishment is justified because offenders deserve to be punished. He offers two objections to this theory. First, he says, there are problems in achieving proportionality between offenses and punishments and that retributivism requires proportionality. Second, he maintains that retributivism justifies punishment in far fewer cases than ordinarily thought. He mentions incompatibilist reasons to think this is true, but focuses more on his influential argument that people are blameworthy (or guilty) only for when they performed an act that they believed was overall morally wrong. This rests on Zimmerman's breakthrough work on this topic.[1]

In Chapter Four, Zimmerman adds that our everyday judgments of responsibility are further undermined by the role of moral luck. He argues for this on the following basis: (1) what we deserve by way of punishment depends on what we are responsible for, (2) what we are responsible for depends on what we can control, and (3) issues of innocence, guilt, and degree of guilt significantly depend on factors outside of our control.

In Chapter Five, Zimmerman argues that there are less repugnant alternatives than punishment that can prevent crime and promote social stability. He mentions addressing issues of social justice (for example, affecting the distribution of food, housing, education, employment, and so on), non-punitive incapacitation, and restitution. He states that there are other tools as well.

One problem with Zimmerman's book is that the two parts of his overall argument are in tension with one another. He argues that most, if not all, responsibility judgments are suspect because of concerns regarding negligence, moral luck, and the standard incompatibilist argument. If these concerns are enough to establish that human beings are not morally responsible for most, if not all, of what they do, then this would undermine most, if not all, concerns about desert (and rights-based) factors. This is because desert and moral rights presuppose moral responsibility.[2] If these factors are undermined, then retributivism fails, as do other non-consequentialist theories. For example, Immanuel Kant and other non-consequentialists cite respect for people's autonomy to explain why the right does not always maximize the good. If Zimmerman undercuts non-consequentialism, then his claim that crime-prevention arguments need to be supplemented by concerns about desert and guilt is also undercut.

Zimmerman would likely respond that he affirms retributivism and immunitivism (the innocent should not be punished because they do not deserve punishment).[3] However, to the extent that very few acts ground deserved punishment, his retributivism has an extremely limited scope. The limitation occurs because many, and perhaps most, acts of force, fraud, or theft are not viewed as overall morally wrong by the agent and hence do not lead to the agent deserving punishment. Thus, Zimmerman can preserve retributivist intuitions only by radically reducing the number of people who deserve punishment.

A second problem is that Zimmerman's arguments against the crime-prevention justifications fail. Consider Zimmerman’s argument against deterrence. He might argue it deters but this is morally irrelevant or it does not deter. He concedes it might deter, but claims that non-punitive means can (realistically) be as effective as a deterrent. However, he provides no empirical evidence for this claim. A purely conceptual argument for this claim cannot work because the claim is empirical. For example, from the armchair we can't determine whether mere incapacitation combined with a therapeutic or loving attitude would be as effective a deterrent as punishment. Even if he could establish that it were as effective, and do so without empirical evidence, Zimmerman would still need to establish that the cost-benefit analysis of an incapacitation-and-therapy institution is superior to punishment. He does not try to do this. One would think that if, on Zimmerman's account, punishment's deterrence justification is a function of its cost-benefit analysis relative to other institutions (and practices), the empirical literature would be relevant.

A third problem is that the book ignores right-forfeiture. Consider restitution in the context of tort law. A wrongdoer (one who has done a wrongful act) has caused harm to another and is made to compensate her. The wrongdoer's right to some of his money is either not infringed or permissibly infringed. Consider the notion that it is not infringed. This might occur if a person's right to his money has a complex content or if it is forfeited. Consider the notion that his right has a complex content. For example, Jones has a right to keep-his-money-unless-he-gives-it-away-or-does-a-right-infringing-act-or-other-wrongdoing-etc. If this is correct, then people's rights play no role in explaining when a person should pay compensation because its scope presupposes rather than justifies that wrongdoing leads to state-enforced compensation. However, rights intuitively seem to explain when compensation is morally and legally required.

Consider the notion that the wrongdoer's right is permissibly infringed. When a person's right is infringed, the infringement gives rise to a prima facie residue-duty, such as a duty to compensate or apologize to the right-holder. But it intuitively seems that wrongdoers made to pay compensation are owed neither compensation nor an apology. For example, consider when one person intentionally breaks a second person's leg and is made to pay the second's medical bills. It intuitively seems neither the second person nor the state owes the first person compensation or an apology. This is true in both morality and law.

The most plausible account is that the wrongdoer forfeits his right to some of his money. If persons can forfeit their right to some of their money, then the issue arises why some wrongdoers do not forfeit their rights against punishment. At the very least, Zimmerman might have addressed what happens to offenders' moral rights. His view that restitution is an alternative to punishment does nothing to show that punishment infringes on an offender's right or that punishment is morally wrong.

A fourth problem is that the book ignores much of the relevant literature. David Boonin's book, The Problem of Punishment, argues for the same thesis (legal punishment is morally wrong).[4]Boonin's book has deservedly received much attention, but Zimmerman's book ignores it. Zimmerman's central argument that people are not responsible for anything but acts known to be wrong has been challenged by George Sher in his book, Who Knew? Responsibility Without Awareness.[5] Sher argues for attributionism (roughly, we are responsible for negligent acts when they flow from our constitutive attributes) and uses it to make sense of the widely held intuition that in some cases, people who negligently injure or kill others are blameworthy. Zimmerman does not discuss Sher's arguments. He also ignores concerns about desert being a part of the good rather than the right.[6] This is odd given that Zimmerman has done important work on the good.[7] In defense of Zimmerman, this book is concise and highly readable in part because it does not get bogged down working through every objection in the literature and is not cluttered with references to the literature.

Despite these criticisms, Zimmerman's book is important and well worth reading. The book's main contribution is to challenge the central assumption in the punishment-literature and the practice and institution of punishment: offenders are responsible for their offenses and deserve punishment. His arguments against this assumption, specifically the ones from negligence, moral luck, and the incompatibility of determinism and free will, will shape the literature, perhaps by moving the pendulum back toward deterrence- and incapacitation-justifications.[8]

[1] See Michael J. Zimmerman, "Moral Responsibility and Ignorance," Ethics 107 (1997): 410-426; Michael J. Zimmerman, "Controlling Ignorance: A Bitter Truth," Journal of Social Philosophy33 (2003): 483-490; Michael J. Zimmerman, Living with Uncertainty: The Moral Significance of Ignorance (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008).

[2] For an argument to the contrary, see Fred Feldman, "Desert: Reconsideration of Some Received Wisdom," Mind 104 (1995): 63-77.

[3] I owe this response to Michael Zimmerman, Personal Communication, October 2, 2011.

[4] David Boonin, The Problem of Punishment (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2008).

[5] George Sher, Who Knew? Responsibility Without Awareness (New York: Oxford University Press, 2009).

[6] For the notion that desert is related to the good, see W. D. Ross, The Right and the Good (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co., 1988), 134-135, 138; Fred Feldman, "Adjusting Utility for Justice: A Consequentialist Reply to the Objection from Justice," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 55 (1995): 567-585; Shelly Kagan, "Equality and Desert," in Louis P. Pojman and Owen McLeod, eds., What Do We Deserve? (New York: Oxford University Press, 1999), 298-314; Thomas Hurka, "The Common Structure of Virtue and Desert," Ethics 112 (2001): 6-31; Neil Feit and Stephen Kershnar, "Explaining the Geometry of Desert," Public Affairs Quarterly 18 (2004): 273-298; Stephen Kershnar, "A Unified Theory of Intrinsic Value," Reason Papers 29 (2007): 19-40.

[7] See Michael J. Zimmerman, The Nature of Intrinsic Value (Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield, 2001).

[8] I am grateful to Michael Zimmerman for his helpful comments and criticisms of this review.