The Impartial Spectator: Adam Smith's Moral Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

D. D. Raphael, The Impartial Spectator: Adam Smith's Moral Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2007, 143pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780921337.

Reviewed by Charlotte Brown, Illinois Wesleyan University


D. D. Raphael's elegant and engaging book on Adam Smith's moral philosophy is an extended version of his 1972 Dawes Hicks Lecture on Philosophy. An authority on the 17th and 18th century British moralists and one of the foremost Smith scholars, he places Smith's project in the context of his philosophical predecessors, identifying both his originality in relation to them and his lasting contributions to moral philosophy. He interweaves his account of Smith's moral theory with descriptions of important changes in Smith's thinking about ethics. Along the way, he corrects misinterpretations, recommends several books and articles, and assesses the various uses to which philosophers such as Firth and Nussbaum have put Smith's theory. At the forefront is Raphael's lively critical appraisal of Smith's moral philosophy.

D. D. Raphael co-edited the Glasgow critical edition of The Theory of Moral Sentiments (TMS) (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1976; corrected reprint 1991). Instead of simply reproducing the 6th edition as did earlier editions, the critical edition painstakingly details revisions among the different editions published during Smith's lifetime. First published in 1759, the  2nd edition of TMS appeared three years later with some substantial revisions. The 3rd, 4th and 5th editions contain only light revisions. The 6th edition, published in 1790, is another matter: Smith added an entirely new part on character and made "drastic revision elsewhere," making it a "much altered book."

Raphael's finely detailed understanding of the revisions Smith made to TMS informs his entire book. In the first chapter, "Two Versions," he shows some frustration with Smith scholars who continue to fail to notice when a particular passage was written and end up misinterpreting him. For example, one writer contrasts the mature realism of The Wealth of Nations with the youthful idealism of TMS, but one of the passages he cites as evidence is taken from the "far from youthful 6th edition." Raphael's constructive use of his knowledge of Smith's revisions to record changes in Smith's thinking about ethics is both informative and interesting.

Raphael devotes nearly half of The Impartial Spectator to an examination of Smith's account of moral judgments, featuring Smith's account of conscience. In the rest of the book, he takes up such topics as Smith's account of virtue, how the 17th and 18th century British moralists characterize the relation between virtue and beauty, and the role of theological considerations in Smith's ethical thought.

In TMS, Smith argues that his predecessors focused too much on the results of people's sentiments. He thinks that "in common life" when we judge someone's sentiments, we take into consideration not only whether they are useful or agreeable, as Hume thinks, but also whether they are appropriate to their causes. When we blame someone for their excesses of grief, for example, we consider not only the "ruinous effects" they produce, but also "the little occasion which was given for them." In "judgments of propriety and impropriety" we assess whether sentiments and actions are appropriate or inappropriate to the circumstances and objects that provoked them.

Smith explains how we come to make these judgments from the point of view of a spectator. When I, as a spectator, judge the feelings and actions of another, I first imagine what feelings would prompt me to act were I in the agent's shoes. I then compare my feelings with the feelings that motivate the agent. I sympathize with the agent if my feelings are the same as his. This gives rise to my approval and the judgment that his motive and action are proper. However, if my feelings differ from the agent's, I disapprove and judge his feelings and conduct to be improper. In this case, I don't sympathize with the agent.

One of Raphael's concerns is to show that imagination plays a larger role than sympathy in Smith's account of judgments of propriety and impropriety. As he points out, an exercise of imagination is required for both judgments of propriety and impropriety, but sympathy occurs only with judgments of propriety -- when the spectator comes to share the agent's feelings. As we will see, imagination plays an even more important role in judgments we make about ourselves.

Raphael wonders, however, whether Smith is correct to characterize the role of sympathy in judgments of propriety as being confined "to sympathy with motive." He thinks Smith's criticism of his predecessors would lead us to expect that he would try to avoid their one-sidedness and represent the role of sympathy in judgments of propriety as involving sympathy with both motive and intended effect. But Smith "decided" that these two elements "belong to different forms of moral judgment." According to Raphael, Smith's considered view is that judgments of propriety and impropriety are "only about motive," while thoughts about the intended effects a spectator imagines an action would have on others come into play in what Smith calls "judgments of merit and demerit."

According to Raphael, it was a "mistake" or "error" for Smith to assign these two elements to two different types of judgments. He speculates that Smith "was led into this error" in order to distinguish his theory from Hume's. But why is it a "mistake"? Raphael assumes that Smith's judgments of propriety may be identified with judgments of right. They are about an agent's character traits and additionally about his actions. His worry is that when we approve of someone's action -- when we judge it to be proper or right -- doesn't our approval need to be based on "some feature of the action rather than the mere thought that you would be moved to do the same thing?" For if we "ask why you would be moved to do the same thing … the answer must lie in some feature of the action, such as good consequences…" (21)

Whether or not it is a mistake to characterize the role of sympathy in judgments of propriety as being limited to sympathy with the motive, there is something puzzling about the standard Smith proposes for propriety. According to Smith, the proper feeling is the one the spectator comes to share with the agent and with which he sympathizes. But why is this the proper or appropriate response? Smith adds to his initial account the idea that the appropriate feeling results from an effort on the part of both the spectator and the agent to harmonize their feelings. Both know that a vicarious feeling is never as strong as a real one. The spectator, realizing that it is hard for him to fully enter into the agent's feelings, tries to imagine the agent's circumstances as vividly and in as much detail as possible, making it more likely he will share the agent's feelings. The agent, realizing how difficult it is for a spectator to enter into his feelings and anxious to have his sympathy, tries to moderate his feelings to the point where spectators can sympathize.

But why is the response in which the spectator and agent can meet, avoiding the extremes on either side, the proper response? Contrast Smith's view with that of Aristotle, who holds that the appropriate response is the mean. He provides an explanation for why the mean is the appropriate response: it is appropriate because it enables human beings to function well. But Smith provides no explanation for why the degree of grief or anger a spectator can share with an agent is the proper one. Perhaps he thinks that the fact that a feeing is sharable somehow shows that it is the proper response.

Raphael's discussion of the way Smith develops the idea of an impartial spectator to explain how we morally judge ourselves is as elegant as it is economical. His discussion spans several chapters, which include a critical appraisal of Smith's theory of conscience and an examination of Smith's account of moral rules and the virtues; but his chapter, "The Impartial Spectator," is the central one. Here Raphael is especially careful to detail Smith's revisions.

Raphael prefaces this discussion with a brief chapter on the role of the 'spectator' in Hutcheson's and Hume's moral theories. On his reading, Smith follows his predecessors in grounding moral judgments in the feelings of a spectator, attempting, as they did, to capture the disinterestedness of the moral sentiments of approval and disapproval. According to Raphael, Hutcheson's and Hume's idea of a spectator is that of a stranger -- someone who is "indifferent in the sense of not being an interested party." (34) All three philosophers aim to provide an empirical account of the moral sentiments.

Hutcheson was the first to insist that our approval of someone else's actions can be disinterested, "uninfluenced by any thought of benefit to oneself." (28) He claims that we possess a special moral sense, in addition to our other senses, that disposes us to feel approval or disapproval when we survey people's character traits and actions. Hume's contribution is that he saw the need to explain our capacity to approve and disapprove. He traces it to sympathy: we sympathize with the person herself and everyone with whom she interacts. We judge her character traits and actions expressive of them to be virtuous or vicious in terms of whether they are good or bad for everyone affected. Raphael thinks that the idea of an impartial spectator is present in Hume, although not the term.

On Raphael's reading of Smith, he only needs the simpler idea of a spectator as "not being an interested party" to explain moral judgments we make about others. His originality and lasting contribution lie in his account of how we come to judge ourselves: how we acquire conscience, how it operates, and how it becomes authoritative.

There are two central features of Smith's explanation of conscience, both of which were present at all stages in the development of his theory. One is that conscience is a social product, a "mirror of social feeling." The other is that an agent is able to judge herself only by imagining what an impartial spectator would approve or disapprove of in her conduct.

Smith first stresses the impartiality of the reactions of spectators in his discussion of the virtue of self-command: when an agent tries to moderate his passions to the point where a spectator can sympathize. The virtue of self-command is essential to our being able to see ourselves as others do. Conscience originally springs from our "social experience" of being judged by others and being spectators who judge others. We have a natural desire to be loved and we dread blame. Because we love praise and hate blame, we learn to see our conduct through the eyes of others. We come to approve or disapprove of ourselves by imagining how spectators would judge us.

Raphael argues that Smith increasingly came to trust "imagination more and society less." (38) One reason is that he was bothered by an objection that Sir Gilbert Elliott raised after TMS first appeared: if conscience is merely a reflection of actual spectators' social attitudes, how would judgments of conscience differ from those of actual spectators?

However, even in the first edition, Smith's spectator isn't an actual bystander, but one we imagine. In the 2nd and 6th editions, Smith stresses even more that the spectator is a creation of imagination. Self-examination requires an ability to divide ourselves:

Whenever I endeavor to examine my own conduct … I divide myself as it were into two persons: and that I, the examiner and judge, represent a different character from that other I, the person whose conduct is examined into and judged of. The first is the spectator… The second is the agent… (TMS III. 1.6)

I become a judge of my own conduct by imagining what I would feel if I were a spectator of my own behavior. I then compare these feelings with the feelings that I as an agent actually have.

This leads to Smith's famous idea of an internal, impartial spectator -- "the man within." Although conscience is initially a product of the approval and disapproval of others, Smith retains the traditional idea that "the voice of conscience represents the voice of God." As a superior tribunal, it may conflict with the judgments of actual spectators. How does conscience gain its independence and become a higher authority?

Once we are capable of judging ourselves, we make a new distinction between being praised and being praiseworthy, being blamed and being blameworthy. We want not only praise, but to be praiseworthy; we dread not only blame, but to be blameworthy. Actual spectators may be partial and ill informed, but we are able to view ourselves without partiality or misunderstanding. I may gain the approval of others, for example, by pretending to be virtuous. But since I am able to judge what others would think of me, if they knew everything and were impartial, I realize that I do not merit praise. Not only may the judgments of the internal, impartial spectator differ from those of actual spectators, conscience comes to represent a higher tribunal. Smith eventually saw that being "flattered by the praise of society," while ignoring the superior verdicts of conscience, is a sign of vanity.

At one point, Raphael remarks that a spectator theory is able to explain more easily third-person judgments, and also second-person judgments, but is "apt to be in difficulties with judgments made in the first person (about 'me' or 'us')." (31) But, on his view, what is original and enduring in Smith's thought is his explanation of our capacity to judge ourselves from the point of view of an impartial spectator. He also notes that a spectator theory is "more comfortable with passing verdicts on what has been done in the past than with considering and deciding what should be done in the future." (31) Does Raphael think that Smith is able to explain how we go from being a spectator of our own conduct to being a moral agent who tries to live up to her own ideals of conduct? In the moment of action, we may not be able to view ourselves impartially. But doesn't the importance of the internal, impartial spectator lie in the fact that the spectator is the person to whom we, as agents, try to conform our conduct, thereby becoming worthy of love and praise? Raphael says that, according to Smith, an agent who attains a high degree of self-command can "identify himself with the imagined spectator to the extent of obliterating the natural feelings of self-regard." (41)

Raphael maintains that Smith's psychological and sociological explanation of conscience also shows that judgments of conscience possess a kind of authority or normativity. Does he think that Smith is able to show that they are authentically normative -- answering a justificatory question about why we ought to approve as an impartial and well-informed conscience would? Or does he think that Smith is answering a question in "moral anthropology" -- explaining why we are inclined to think that the judgments of conscience are normative?

Interestingly, Hume sketches a process that is similar in some ways to Smith's account of conscience. According to Hume, sympathy ensures that we will catch the moral feelings other people have about us. Since we care deeply about what others think about us, our internalization of the praise and blame of others has the effect of making us see ourselves as others see us, valuing ourselves as others value us. Sympathy thus pressures us to survey ourselves as we appear to others. Hume says that sympathy may even go so far as to make us disapprove of our own vices, even though they benefit us.

Anyone interested in Adam Smith's moral philosophy or in 17th and 18th century British moral philosophy will find Raphael's The Impartial Spectator a stimulating book.