The Importance of Subjectivity: Selected Essays in Metaphysics and Ethics

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T.L.S. Sprigge, The Importance of Subjectivity: Selected Essays in Metaphysics and Ethics, Leemon B. McHenry (ed.), Oxford University Press, 2011, 355pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199591541.

Reviewed by William Seager, University of Toronto Scarborough


Not by nature but by doctrine, Timothy Sprigge was an iconoclastic philosopher. Trained in British analytic philosophy (he studied with Ayer), whose argumentative standards and clarity of thought he retained throughout his career, Sprigge nonetheless was a systematic metaphysician who developed and defended a quite grand panpsychist form of absolute idealism. He championed this overarching world scheme in a number of books, most notably The Vindication of Absolute Idealism (1984). His idealist metaphysics, as well as other metaphysical views such as the denial of the reality of time, stemmed from his conception of the nature of consciousness and flowed out to inform his ethical views, both theoretical and practical.

The present volume is a judicious and representative selection from his extensive set of published articles. As editor Leemon McHenry notes, Sprigge regarded the book as the natural home of philosophical discourse, but in addition to nine books he published a hundred articles and book chapters, twenty-two of which reappear here. These essays cover the main topics with which Sprigge was most concerned: the nature of consciousness, idealist metaphysics (his own as well as general surveys of the doctrine) and the implications of his metaphysics for ethics (most especially with regard to the treatment of animals and the question of whether nature possesses intrinsic moral value).

On each of these topics Sprigge had interesting and novel things to say, always in admirably clear prose even when the ideas were difficult and intrinsically obscure or complex. Sprigge's views were also generally unfashionable. It is then sad that he died in 2007, just as panpsychism was beginning to enjoy something of a revival in the world of analytic philosophy, for example in the work of David Chalmers, Gregg Rosenberg and Galen Strawson. However, the iconoclasm of his philosophical theories did not seem to bother Sprigge very much, who ended his doggerel-limerick history of philosophy with:

24. The truth of all this it seems plain
Is that philosophy would indeed be in vain
If its aim were a view
So objectively true
It will not be discarded again.

25. But cheer yourselves up my good friends
Though it's true that the search never ends
We may each in our day
Have our personal say
And feel free to ignore current trends.

I will try here to give some outline of Sprigge's central contentions along with a rough account of the main arguments for them, as presented in the articles reprinted in the volume under review.

It all starts with consciousness. Perhaps it is better known now than it once was that Sprigge anticipated Thomas Nagel by a few years in advancing the most famous definition of consciousness as 'what it is like' to be a certain kind of conscious creature or to undergo a certain kind of conscious state. In his 1971 paper 'Final Causes', Sprigge wrote: 'consciousness is that which one characterizes when one tries to answer the question what it is like or might be like to be a certain object in a certain situation' (p. 36). In many places, Sprigge develops Nagel- or Jackson-like arguments against physicalism, but seemingly in relative independence from these thinkers. He really did come at these issues from an entirely different direction, informed most by predecessors such as Bradley, James, Husserl, Whitehead and Hartshorne (plus, it's worth mentioning, certain strains of ancient Indian philosophy). But on this issue he ends up in much the same conceptual location: 'the existence of conscious states is logically independent of physical facts' (p. 82).

Sprigge makes a number of important points about consciousness, notably that consciousness somehow 'contains' its objects, that it possesses a kind of holistic character even while 'decomposable' into subsidiary features of experience, that it is always perspective-dependent or from a 'point of view', that it is in some sense self-knowing or 'self-illuminating', that it always possesses a kind of evaluative valence and that this valence seems to incorporate a mysterious kind of intrinsic linkage between feeling and motivation. In a delightful evocation of some of these points, Sprigge writes about two people looking at the same room:

it is the same chair, that same wallpaper, and that same angry behaviour experienced, though, as an ingredient in a different version of the common world than mine, a version in which the chair is just as solid but felt here below rather than seen over there, in which the wallpaper is just as much out there but excitingly sophisticated rather than vulgar, and in which the behaviour is just as much a matter of what his tongue and arms are doing, but in which they are the only possible responses of a self-respecting man rather than the effects of too much to drink. (p. 54)

Or, more tersely, he defines consciousness as 'the value charged space of objects around [the subjects] which [the subjects] were thinking of as the world itself' (p. 283).

These phenomenological features of consciousness play into much larger themes which Sprigge discusses throughout the book. I cannot begin to do justice to the argumentative structure which he develops in these essays, especially given that Sprigge himself frequently warns the reader that he is providing only a cursory version, chopped down from the longer treatments given in his books. Nonetheless, I think it's important to see how Sprigge's views on the nature of consciousness feed into some of his larger metaphysical aims.

The position most characteristic of Sprigge is his panpsychist idealism. Roughly speaking, the view is that reality is constituted by innumerable streams of consciousness which are themselves made up of moments of experience which encompass their own specious present (a large issue looms here: what makes a set of such momentary episodes of consciousness into one stream, especially in light of Sprigge's contention that time is unreal?). Some of these moments are 'elementary' in the sense that they do not contain discernible complexity of content. What we might then call 'molecular' moments of consciousness are formed out of these elementary moments to form more complex consciousnesses, which have a diversity of internal content, and which form their own streams which can be called minds. Sprigge writes that 'elementary centres of experience can enter into . . . structured systems, and these structured systems can be related to other such structured systems, so as to form a higher-level structured system, and so on' (p. 208). Presumably, our human form of consciousness is pretty high up in this gappy hierarchy, but how far the hierarchy extends above and below us, and how densely populated is this range are rather imponderable questions. Sprigge is happy to assign consciousness fairly widely 'below' through the animal kingdom, but not to plants or inanimate objects; he does not say much about supra-consciousness, save for one special case.

Ultimately, this hierarchical system of ever more complex minds merges into a single overarching stream of consciousness which corresponds to what Sprigge calls 'God'. Obviously, this is more the god of Spinoza than Abraham; in his 1997 paper 'Pantheism', Sprigge lays out fourteen attributes commonly assigned to God and considers how his conception of the 'universal mind' shares a fair number of them, although notably lacking the attribute of being the world creator. Sprigge was a spiritual man and held that his view of the 'absolute' answered well enough to that divine nature glimpsed in mystical states, which for him especially included tranquil communion with nature.

One could raise many problems with Sprigge's conception of the absolute as a single mind encompassing all streams of consciousness. Perhaps the most obvious question asks how the streams of experience, conceived of as separate minds (such as we possess) can either form a larger mind or somehow be decomposable aspects of such a mind. Sprigge just says that they can. This is a very basic problem, faced by many forms of panpsychism, which goes back at least to William James's attack on the so-called 'mind-dust theory' developed by a number of thinkers in the nineteenth century, and James's later struggles to embrace such a view.

Although Sprigge writes here in an atomistic, compositional vein, it is more in line with absolute idealism to work in reverse; to consider the hierarchy as fundamentally decompositional rather than compositional. The whole is metaphysically primary. In a discussion of Bradley and Russell on relations (which contains much of interest apart from this issue), Sprigge approvingly follows Bradley's idea that, as Sprigge puts it, 'the monist . . . regards the category of whole and part as ultimately misleading . . . because he thinks the so-called parts are better regarded as aspects of the total character of what, for lack of a better word, he may still call the whole' (pp. 164-5). But this won't really evade the problem, which now becomes one of how essential parts of the universal mind can 'appear to themselves' as separate and in fact can, in some measure in line with our sense of agency, actually be separate.

This question raises another problem stemming from the juxtaposition of the universal mind with its components. Sprigge maintains that complex consciousness has the feature that its components (for example, colours, sounds, smells, tastes, tactile experiences, etc.), which can enter consciousness alone or separately, are experientially different when they enter into and form one's current overall state of consciousness. At least, I think this follows from a general claim which Sprigge definitely does endorse, namely 'the qualities which things exhibit when seen in isolation are incompatible with the qualities they seem to have as elements in a larger totality'. The problem is that it is hard to see how one experiential feature can have distinct, in fact incompatible, qualities as it appears to itself first under the inner gaze of an individual sub-mind and then (so to speak) under the gaze of the universal mind.

On the other hand, this feature of experience could provide a novel and potentially illuminating account of the unity of consciousness. On this picture, the co-consciousness of all the diverse features present in any moment of conscious experience would actually effect a transformation in their precise individual qualities as experienced. It seems intuitively plausible that, for example, a sound within an experiential totality is somewhat different than when heard in isolation. The unity of consciousness would then be explicated in terms of this transformative power of jointly co-constituting experience.

Be that as it may (and I can't find Sprigge making such a suggestion explicitly), Sprigge has his own account of the unity of consciousness which is also interesting. He says that the unity of consciousness derives from the fact that only consciousness has a 'definite reality'. Note that by consciousness here Sprigge means the elementary units of consciousness, which are momentary episodes bounded by a specious present. These have a kind of absolute definiteness which nothing else possesses. This definiteness implies that there is a uniquely correct answer to the question of 'what it is like' to be such a consciousness. Sprigge attempts to explain this somewhat obscure idea by comparing such momentary consciousnesses with more familiar objects. Considering ordinary physical objects, such as tables, chairs etc., Sprigge says, 'If I ask how many physical objects there are in a room the answer depends on an entirely optional way of thinking of that part of the physical world as composed of what I choose to call units' (p. 64).

What Sprigge had in mind can be highlighted by standard worries about the identity conditions of ordinary objects from a physicalist perspective. What, for example, is a table? One might, as a first pass at least, be inclined to say that a table is a set of particles (molecules of wood say) arranged 'tablewise'. But this won't do. There are literally billions and billions of such sets in the near vicinity of anything we'd like to call a table -- but only one table (presumably). Of course, relative to our purposes, perceptions, interests and plans, it is easy enough to pick out the nearest table, but that makes tables dependent on our consciousness. This is the arbitrary, or in Sprigge's word, optional, aspect of the identity conditions of ordinary objects. Consciousness by contrast is not beholden to how conscious beings decide how they'd like to divide up the world.

To me, the two ideas about unity of consciousness go together. The way that the elements of a state of consciousness are mutually defining (according to the first idea) provides the content for the absolutely definite, non-arbitrary, reality of moments of consciousness.

Amongst the features of consciousness which Sprigge most emphasized, two are especially important. The first is its perspectival nature: we experience the world from a definite viewpoint as if we were its centre. Overall, these perspectives include all our particular forms of consciousness, be it sensory, hedonic or intellectual, which taken together specify the what it is like to be us in our current situation. The second critical feature is that consciousness is world involving. Sprigge labeled the intentionality of consciousness self-transcendence: 'consciousness . . . is self-transcendent, and there is a mystery in this. All the mental act can confront directly is the other contents of the conscious state, yet somehow it intrinsically refers to what is beyond' (pp. 48-9). (Sprigge favoured internalism over externalism about content, but space constraints forbid my going into his arguments.)

Remarkably, Sprigge argued that these features of consciousness lead to idealism. His argument is a complex dilemma but fundamentally depends on demonstrating that our ordinary conception of a mind independent physical world is actually inconsistent (so his general strategy follows some traditional lines of idealist thought). This argument works by noting that we naively take our consciousness to in some sense contain the world around us insofar as we are aware of it: 'our most basic conception of it [i.e. the physical world] is as an indefinitely larger reality of which our perceptual fields are fragments' (pp. 110-11). There are two supposed problems with this.

One is that the indefiniteness exists in two directions. There is the indefinite outward expanse of the physical world beyond me, and there is the indefinite inward expanse of the physical world when examined at closer and closer range. This inward indefiniteness Sprigge thought was incoherent because nothing in possible experience could answer to it. At least, this is what I think he means when he says that 'This conception is not really a coherent one, for nothing with all that detail can really be identical with a perceived object, qua fragment of my perceptual field, where such detail is simply absent' (p. 111) (the argument seems to be similar to Sellars's famous pink ice cube argument, though Sellars was not a philosopher that Sprigge read). As Sprigge was well aware, traditional solutions to this sort of problem in one way or another depend upon taking conscious experience to be some kind of representation of the world, which can be more or less accurate or even fundamentally inaccurate. But Sprigge seems correct that our intuitive or naive view of the world as perceived most emphatically does not seem to be a mere representation of it. And as we shall see, these traditional dodges lead towards panpsychist idealism via another path.

The naive view suffers from another -- and according to Sprigge, more troubling -- inconsistency. Our naive view naturally includes other consciousnesses, more or less similar to our own, belonging to people and many animals. These too 'contain' the world within them but each from their own perspective. But these perspectives are contradictory, the most fundamental incoherence being that 'mine has my body as a centre, and they have theirs as a centre' (p. 111).

It's worth mentioning that Sprigge also maintained a sophisticated version of the Berkeleyan argument that the features we ascribe to the physical world, in our naive conception of it, are logically dependent on consciousness, but I won't address this here.

In the face of these putative inconsistencies, Sprigge considered a number of options in the neighbourhood of our naive conception of the physical world, up to and including the limiting case of phenomenalism, but found them all either internally inconsistent or, in the last case, such as to make the world obviously dependent on consciousness. But surely, one would think, it is possible to reject the naive view of the physical world without embracing idealism. In that case, one is essentially positing a noumenal (but physical; or, at least, not mental) realm entirely distinct from our naive conception of the physical world. One is then free to say, blessed by time honoured tradition, that the world we experience is merely an effect on consciousness of this unknown noumenal realm which is in itself fully objective, perspective free and characterized by properties which are not in any way dependent on consciousness.

So, the dilemma is that either we accept our naive conception of the physical world as reality but then find it dissolving into incoherence or we embrace an inaccessible, perhaps essentially unknowable, noumenal world of which consciousness is merely one of its effects. Now, in a way, Sprigge accepts the second horn (as must anyone who accepts the dilemmic structure as Sprigge lays it out). But he denies that the noumenal realm should be identified with the physical world and instead tries to argue that it is actually fundamentally mental in nature.

This denial is dependent on a certain view about what we can know about the physical world once we jettison the claim that experience presents it as it is in itself. Following such thinkers as Whitehead, Eddington and Russell, Sprigge contends that all we can know of the noumenal world is what he calls structural features, that is, the relational structure revealed in our observations, both scientific and more prosaic. We may try to assert that physics, say, provides us with knowledge of the ultimate nature of reality, which is after all the belief of many scientists (the American LHC Communication Task Force, for example, seeks to 'promote recognition by key audiences of the value to the nation of particle physics, because of . . . its unique role in discovery of the fundamental nature of the universe'). But we then face the sobering realization that physics tells us nothing about the nature of matter, only its relations to other bits of matter, space, time and energy and, of course, its effects on consciousness under very particular circumstances.

Sprigge contends that the relational structure revealed by science stands in need of a 'qualitative' foundation. 'There must', says Sprigge, 'be something concrete which exemplifies the abstract structure' (p. 83), or, as he puts it in a more metaphorical vein, 'scientific theories are to us akin to musical scores for the deaf' (p. 114). Indeed, one might be tempted to think that this is precisely the difference between the merely abstract and the concrete. While there are those who defend pure relationalism (notably structural realists in the philosophy of science), I think the argument is reasonably compelling.

Panpsychism results if we take consciousness to form the qualitative bedrock underneath the evident relational structure which science can reveal. If we remain agnostic about the nature of this foundational reality, we may tend towards a neutral monism or perhaps a Spinozistic dual-aspect account. Needless to say, Sprigge opts for the panpsychist view, but he is aware that this is a kind of basic theoretical choice point not strictly forced by philosophical argument. That is, it is open to us to embrace agnosticism and 'decide that we cannot know the qualitative nature of matter' (p. 114). This would be an absolute limit on human knowledge. Sprigge plumped for the more optimistic view that we can know the inward nature of matter, which is in some sense experiential (the 'some sense' is needed since there is no claim that everything in the physical world possesses a mind, or that the basic experiential 'units' have experiences anything like ours).

Even if they are not conclusive, Sprigge advances a number of considerations which count against agnosticism. One of these is a kind of argument from economy: the only non-structural feature we know of is consciousness itself. The overall account has it that 'consciousness, in a great variety of forms, is the noumenal essence of what presents itself to us as physical reality', but 'in the case of our own brains . . . we do confront the noumenal essence itself' (p. 116). It then seems unnecessarily profligate to hypothesize a second, or 'deeper' noumenal essence which we miss in our own experience (blinded, as it were, by consciousness itself). The advantage to such profligacy is that we can avoid assigning experiential qualities throughout nature. But that is no advantage to someone such as Sprigge who thinks that ultimately all that exists is consciousness.

Sprigge has another and deeper argument which is based upon the claim that relations should be in some way reducible to properties of the relata. That is a misleading way to put his point, however, for it misses the distinction between what Sprigge calls monadism and monism. Leibniz is of course the prime exponent of monadism, according to which relational facts are reducible to the properties of the individual relata, where such properties are all 'accessible independently of the relational truths grounded by their conjunction' (p. 176). A merely illustrative example of such relations, which Sprigge calls ideal, would be that of x having twice the mass of y, which intuitively is exhaustively reducible to x having a mass of 10 kg and y having a mass of 5 kg, plus some simple arithmetic. By contrast, monism holds that relations are holistic, by which Sprigge means that the relations stem from abstracting the relata from a whole of which they are essential and co-defining components. That is, things can stand in a relation insofar as they are 'components within a more comprehensive whole, and components of such a kind that any conception we form of them as though they were individuals in their own right contains an element of distortion' (p. 177). We have already seen that one (presumably the only) sort of totality which meets this condition and which possesses definite reality is consciousness.

This issue obviously connects to the argument that there must be a qualitative basis for the structural or relational properties which science reveals, and Sprigge connects these in a very interesting way. One prominent structural feature of the physical world is the system of causal relations by which it evolves in time. The Humean account of causation implicitly rejects the demand for a qualitative foundation of causal relations, or, at least, it rejects the claim of reducibility: they are metaphysically mutable relations between independent existents. The general form of this thesis Sprigge labels Hume's Principle (a topic lately of renewed interest in analytic philosophy): 'there cannot be necessary connections between distinct existences' (p. 76). Sprigge's account of holistic relations would appear to threaten Hume's Principle, and he links this to another feature of consciousness in an ingenious fashion.

Sprigge considers that the hedonic features of consciousness we call pleasure and pain are intrinsically linked to behaviour or, it would be better to say, motivation (for it would be easy to imagine a thought experiment where devious surgery causes mismatches between hedonic tone and overt behaviour). The hedonic features are 'magnetic for the will' (p. 254). This is not a metaphysically optional connection but expresses a true necessity and one we can have knowledge of. Yet it is not analytic that certain feelings will tend to cause certain sorts of behaviour (hence, on the Humean picture, there should be a world where tissue damage causes feelings with the quality of pleasure which then leads to aversive behaviour). At the same time, Sprigge endorses the principle that necessities are knowable a priori: necessities are such that it should be 'transparent to mind that things could not be otherwise' (p. 81). I think the idea here is that our acquaintance with the features of consciousness is revealing a nature or essence according to which we can understand the way it underlies certain causal relations.

This audacious idea would complete the account of monistic relational reduction, bringing causation into the fold and at the same time providing another reason for taking consciousness, as the sole place we are aware of where distinct existences are necessarily connected, to be the qualitative ground for the structural facts that science reveals and to which its investigations are limited.

We've been investigating how Sprigge's analysis of consciousness fed into and motivated his general metaphysical theory of the world. I want to conclude with a few remarks about how the metaphysics in turn informs some ethical issues with which Sprigge was deeply concerned. These are the treatment of animals and the question of whether there is a general value to existence in general (at least some kinds of existences), as propounded by followers of 'deep ecology'. As for animals and our duties to them, Sprigge held what I think are quite common and intuitively plausible views (following such thinkers as Peter Singer and Tom Regan). Animals (at least many of them) are conscious beings and can suffer pain and enjoy pleasure, and this in itself generates a moral obligation to them. Many of the animals we use for our own purposes (as food, or as research subjects) are treated abominably, in violation of this obligation. Appreciation of this led Sprigge to adopt vegetarianism, and he argued against the use of animals in research. In neither case were these commitments absolute. A case could be made for certain experimental uses of animals, and Sprigge allowed that there was nothing wrong with eating animals that had not to that end spent a life of misery and suffering.

As I say, these are eminently reasonable views, hard to deny even if harder still to always live up to for many of us. Perhaps more interesting are Sprigge's views on deep ecology. Sprigge held, and it would seem to follow pretty directly from his metaphysics, that the only thing of intrinsic value was consciousness. But he did not hold that everything in the world is a conscious being. Rocks, plants, buildings, planets and so on ad infinitum are not themselves conscious. They are part of the phenomenal, rather than noumenal, world and recognizable as such because they are dependent for their being on the consciousness of some other thing (as discussed above, their existence is 'optional', dependent on certain acts of conceptualization).

Thus one might think that Sprigge would have little time for deep ecology. In fact, he defended the claim that inanimate, unconscious beings could have intrinsic value. His metaphysics allowed him to develop a nice distinction by which the two claims are made consonant with one another. The basic insight is that although consciousness is required for the existence of the phenomenal realm (e.g., a beautiful river or city), the value of these things does not reside in their producing particular kinds of conscious states in some real or notional observer. Sprigge tries to elucidate this idea with the example of Edinburgh (where he taught for some twenty-five years). He writes that

I would think it a tragedy if the New Town in Edinburgh was destroyed. That which I regard as valuable here cannot be thought of as existing without its value if no one with an appropriate cultural background was there to perceive it. On the other hand, it is not mere psychological states of those who wander around Edinburgh which have value. The value pertains to a common object which can exist for their consciousness. (p. 340)

This rather subtle doctrine is not strictly dependent on his absolute idealism, but only on the weaker (but still, I would think, quite radical) view that non-conscious objects are in some way dependent on consciousness, via our way of applying concepts to the flux of experience.

I have not been able here to explore a number of other important aspects of Sprigge's philosophy, notably his views on time, ineffability, the privacy of experience and the self-illuminating nature of consciousness, and what I have given is just a rough sketch of his overall position. But I hope to have brought something of the interconnected richness and interest of Sprigge's views. The book is a delight to read and much can be learned from it.