The Innovations of Idealism

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Bubner, Rudiger, The Innovations of Idealism, translated by Nicholas Walker, Cambridge, 2003, 284pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521662621.

Reviewed by Bill Bristow, University of California, Irvine


The Innovations of Idealism is a translation from the German of a collection of essays – originally published in 1995 – written by Rüdiger Bubner, who has been a leading contributor to the hermeneutical approach in German philosophy for many years. The essays concern various facets of the post-Kantian Idealist movement in German philosophy and culture. In addition to discussions of the core doctrines of the main philosophers of the period, Fichte, Schelling and Hegel, there are also essays focusing on relatively marginal figures (marginal relative to the philosophy of the period, anyway): for example, Schleiermacher, Friedrich Schlegel, and Goethe. There is no over-arching argument that binds the essays together; they allow of being read in any order. However, the essays are loosely bound together by interesting and important themes that thread through the collection.

Perhaps the dominant theme in the collection is the relation of metaphysics to history in the philosophy of this period. The attempt to incorporate the history of metaphysics (as reflecting the history of culture) into the system of metaphysics is certainly one of the grand innovations of German Idealism. In Hegel’s system in particular, we find the attempt to overcome the traditional dualism between historical knowledge and philosophical or rational knowledge. Bubner clearly approves of this bold, multi-faceted ambition and investigates different facets of it in several of his essays.

The marked enthusiasm of many of the thinkers of this period for ancient Greek thought and culture, particularly for Plato, is important background to the development of the ambition to mate history and metaphysics. In the first essay in the volume, “Schelling’s Discovery and Schleiermacher’s Appropriation of Plato,” Bubner discusses the young Schelling’s role in encouraging enthusiasm for Plato’s thought. Schelling was already reading Plato in the original as a young student in the Tübingen Theological Seminary, where his passion for Plato’s thought was shared with his fellow students, Hegel and Hölderlin. Bubner argues that primary among the aspects of Plato’s thought that so enthralled the young Schelling was the fact that Plato’s work “represents the status of philosophy prior to the dissolution of the unified mythological world-picture produced by the negative power of the reflective understanding” (38). The enthusiasm for Plato was symptomatic of a counter-cultural yearning (shared among the famous fellow students of the Tübingen Stift) for a unity in thought and culture, a unity which these students took to be expressed in Plato’s metaphysics and in ancient Greek culture in general, and which they felt strongly in need of in the context of the increasing specialization and alienation characteristic of the advance of modern culture. This tendency of modern culture was exemplified, in particular, by the increasing specialization in the sciences, the increasingly sharp divide between arts and sciences, and the growing gulf between theoretical knowledge and human existence as lived. Interestingly, then, the return by the young idealists to Plato’s metaphysics – which expressed for them a lost unity in thought that they aspired to recover for us in the modern period – bespeaks a broadly negative or condemnatory attitude toward modernity or toward the “progress” of history.

Clearly the course of German Idealism takes a decisive turn in its relation to history when the task of philosophy becomes interpreted as not, as in this early period, the negation of historical progression through the recovery of an original unity, but rather the incorporation of historical progression into the system of metaphysics itself. As Bubner discusses in several essays, Hegel’s system is unparalleled in the seriousness of its attempt to effect the alchemical bonding of metaphysics and history. In the essay “Transcendental Philosophy and the Problem of History,” Bubner traces some of the essential developments in the genesis of this project, from Kant’s essay on universal history through contributions by Fichte and Schelling to Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit. The interesting twist in this essay is Bubner’s claim at the end that Hegel’s Phenomenology, despite its historical methodology, reflects essentially the same condemnatory attitude, from the standpoint of the desire for philosophical knowledge, towards “the historical as such” that one finds in Schelling’s essay on the philosophy of history written almost a decade earlier (1797/8). Bubner writes that, according to the Phenomenology, “[w]hat appears as historical is precisely what can not yet be brought into fully adequate theoretical form” (author’s emphasis, 117). Putting this together with Bubner’s remarks in other essays – in particular in his essay on Hegel’s Science of Logic, which he interprets as attempting a metaphysics “that finally absorbs its own history” (74) – Bubner’s position seems to be that Hegel’s distinctive ambition of unifying the metaphysical and the historical emerges only after publication of the Phenomenology. This contention, though thought-provoking, is not very compelling – at least absent further defense. The decisive turn in Hegel’s thought, relative to this issue at least, seems clearly marked in the famous demand in the Preface to the Phenomenology that the absolute (as that which metaphysicians have forever been trying to know) must be grasped not only as substance but also as subject. This demand implies that the wayward path to philosophical cognition (which for Hegel in 1806 includes the distinctively modern structures of alienation that the young Stift students so chafed against) must (somehow) be understood as intrinsic to philosophical cognition, not merely as a ladder to be subsequently kicked away.

Of course, it is easier to see the broad shape of Hegel’s ambition here and to feel the need to which it responds, than to discern how Hegel concretely attempts to carry it out or the extent to which he succeeds. Does Hegel show us a way to avoid the unhappy choice between capitulating to what Bubner calls “the historically conditioned character of our concepts” on the one hand and attempting to achieve philosophical cognition through the mere abstraction from that historical character on the other? In the essays in which he addresses this question, Bubner perhaps shows more optimism than most. At the end of the essay on Hegel’s Logic referred to above, “Hegel’s Science of Logic: The Completion or Sublation of Metaphysics?” Bubner makes an interesting (if sketchy) comparison of Hegel’s Logic to contemporary semantic theory and hermeneutics. The core point of similarity is meaning holism: that the semantic unit has its meaning only in relation to the whole of which it is a part, not by correlation with an extra-conceptual given. However, Bubner claims that Hegel’s Logic has the following advantage over contemporary semantic theory: whereas in semantic theory “this relationship between the [semantic] unit and the whole that is presupposed here itself remains shrouded in obscurity” (79), in the Logic the work of determining the successive concepts consists in the work of determining or clarifying their relationship to the presupposed, background whole (81-82). Bubner’s main point with the comparison is that, while the perspectives of semantic holism and hermeneutics must merely acknowledge “the necessity of simply living with the historicity of language,” exactly because they leave unclarified the background whole in its relation to the parts, the procedure of Hegel’s Logic enables the rational comprehension of the historically conditioned character of our concepts; and thus Hegel’s Logic, as Bubner puts it, conquers “the dangerous challenge of history” (83).

Bubner acknowledges that Hegel’s alleged achievement here is put in doubt by the notoriously problematic “aspect of closure” that marks his thought (83). If Hegel’s project of conceptual articulation in the Logic depends on the completed whole, on a final endpoint, then it seems to fall back into the traditional denial of the historically conditioned character of the metaphysical concepts; without this closure, however, it seems not to offer a level of rational comprehension beyond what is on offer from the frankly contingent (historicist) perspectives of semantic theory and hermeneutics. (We are presented again with the old unhappy choice.) Bubner devotes a separate essay, “Closure and the Understanding of History,” to struggling with this notorious problem. The form in which the problem presents itself in this essay is to understand Hegel’s explicit anchoring of systematic philosophy “in the demands of the time,” while still avoiding the historical relativism that that anchoring may seem to imply (see 163). Bubner seems more willing in his interpretation to risk the relativism than to risk falling back into the unhistorical philosophical thinking characteristic of the tradition. “What I am principally concerned to challenge here,” Bubner writes, “is the frequently expressed view that Hegel’s philosophy of history is actually based upon a metaphysics that is essentially enthroned beyond history itself and functions like some sovereign puppeteer pulling the strings of historical change” (172). Bubner interprets Hegel’s gesture of closure as a relative closure, relative to the specific tasks of the time that give rise to the philosophy; he denies that Hegel ever meant to claim an absolute closure. Bubner’s line of interpretation is suggestive, but the reader needs more discussion – more discussion than could be provided in the space of an essay, I suppose – in order to understand how the merely relative closure can be understood as compatible with the strong claims for rational comprehension that Hegel makes.

It is, of course, quite unfair to demand of writing of this form (the essay) and scope (ranging widely, as the essays do, both as a collection and individually) that it solve to the reader’s satisfaction any of the core paradoxes of German Idealist thought. Rather, writing of this genre has to offer things of the following sort: provocative suggestions for new lines of interpretation, surprising and productive juxtapositions and comparisons of views of the period, helpful historical background that may fund new lines of interpretation, et cetera. Judged within its genre, this volume has a lot to offer.

The virtues of the genre are strongly manifest in the last set of essays in the volume, which concern another theme that runs through the volume as a whole; namely, the relation of the idealist projects to aesthetics. Two of my favorite essays in the collection belong to this set: “Fichte and Schlegel,” and “The Dialectical Significance of Romantic Irony.” Both treat of Friedrich Schlegel’s “romantic transformation” of Fichte’s thought (195). In these two essays, Bubner traces Schlegel’s transformation of (a) Fichte’s intensive reflections on philosophical form and his demand for systematic completion in philosophy into the romantic literary form of the fragment (192-3); (b) Fichte’s distinction between the standpoint of philosophy and the standpoint of life into the romantic intention “to allow thought to pass over into life” (197); (c) and Fichte’s markedly unironical attempts to provide a philosophical system that is complete and self-grounded into romantic irony, which is conscious in its aspiration for completeness of the impossibility of it (215). Bubner’s account of the various facets of this fascinating transformation is playful, stimulating and enlightening.

In the short forward to this English edition of his essays, Bubner expresses the desire that the volume contribute to the ongoing task of mediation between the so-called Continental and the so-called analytic traditions in contemporary philosophy (ix-x). (The book is published in the Modern European Philosophy series of Cambridge University Press, which has contributed a very great deal to this work of mediation, at least from this side of the divide.) However, Bubner’s essays are deeply rooted, in both style and substance, in the Continental (more specifically, German) tradition, and he engages little in these essays with scholarship in the analytic tradition. Despite this, I believe the volume contributes to this mediation. For all the much-remarked renaissance of interest by English-language philosophers in German Idealist thought, the attention of analytic philosophers has tended to be rather narrowly focused in this field on a small number of figures in the tradition (on Hegel and Fichte, mostly), and on a relatively small number of (admittedly very important) themes (the sociality of rational norms, for example, or the place of individual freedom within the structure of social institutions embodying rational norms). Some of the themes most dear to the German Idealists themselves remain relatively unexplored by English-language philosophers in the context of this renaissance of interest: e.g., the relation of the tasks of philosophy to history, to art, and to the tasks of human existence. Since these latter themes are just the dominant themes of Bubner’s essays, one may hope that this translation of Bubner’s stimulating and accessible essays will contribute to broadening the scope of analytic engagement with German Idealist thought.