The Intentional Spectrum and Intersubjectivity: Phenomenology and the Pittsburgh Neo-Hegelians

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Michael D. Barber, The Intentional Spectrum and Intersubjectivity: Phenomenology and the Pittsburgh Neo-Hegelians, Ohio University Press, 2011, 326pp., $69.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780821419618.

Reviewed by Chauncey Maher, Dickinson College


Barber aims to clarify and evaluate the work of Robert Brandom and John McDowell, the Pittsburgh Neo-Hegelians of his title, by bringing it into conversation with phenomenology (pp. xv-xvi, 87). While several philosophers have challenged or extended Brandom's or McDowell's claims from broadly phenomenological points of view, no one has written a book trying to spell out systematically what phenomenology can teach Brandom and McDowell.[1] So, a book with Barber's aim is welcome. What would it take it to hit that mark? Barber would need to give a good summary of Brandom's and McDowell's views, identifying what holds them together philosophically (saying, e.g., what makes them "Neo-Hegelians"); and he would need to explain how phenomenology subverts, extends, or reinforces those views. Unfortunately, Barber misses the mark. He is unclear or inaccurate about Brandom's and McDowell's views in key places; he does not explain what holds them together philosophically; and he does not explain what big lessons phenomenology has to teach them.

Barber's basic organizing idea is this: he will start with the debate on perception between Brandom and McDowell, which will lead to a discussion of their views on intersubjectivity and on the nature of philosophy. But his presentation of the debate on perception is unclear or inaccurate on key points. Let me indicate several of these.

Chapter One, "The Debate About Perception" begins with a discussion of linguistic meaning. Readers who aren't familiar with Brandom's and McDowell's views will probably be confused. And, in fact, Barber does seem to take such readers as his audience: "I hope to show phenomenologists how their approach to philosophy is highly relevant to this discussion [between Brandom and McDowell]" (p. xii). Only in §1.2, when he begins talking about Brandom's view of observation, does it start to become clear why he would begin by talking about linguistic meaning. But even there Barber doesn't acknowledge that his presentation begins in an odd place.

§1 of Chapter One is called "Representationalism versus Inferentialism." There I would expect Barber to explain that Brandom and McDowell disagree about how to understand linguistic meaning. Brandom thinks we should understand linguistic meaning by first understanding the norm-governed practices of "giving and asking for reasons." He calls this general approach "inferentialism."[2] Brandom contrasts it with representationalism, according to which the theorist starts with the meaning of sub-sentential expressions, and then explains the meaning of sentences in terms of the meaning and arrangement of their parts.[3] In short, inferentialism gives explanatory priority to inference, whereas representationalism gives it to representation. Brandom makes it seem as though inferentialism is the only alternative to representationalism. McDowell denies that, holding that one can and should start with both inference and representation.[4]

Barber does not explain those positions clearly or accurately. (The preceding paragraph could serve as a starting point for a fuller presentation.) Moreover, in the first few pages of Chapter One, Barber mentions "substitution and anaphora," "Tarskian T-sentences," and "material inferences," with nearly no explanation, as though readers will understand what he's talking about (pp. 2, 3, 4). But given that his target audience seems to be people who are not already versed in the jargon of philosophy of language, they will probably be confused.

§1.1 of Chapter One is entitled "Inferentialism Before Representationalism?" But that title misrepresents the issue that the section purports to summarize. As we just saw, the relevant issue dividing Brandom and McDowell is not whether inferentialism -- a position in the philosophy of language -- comes before representationalism. Rather, the issue is whether inference -- a semantic relationship -- should be explanatorily prior to representation. Barber thus seems to conflate philosophical positions with semantic relationships -- an odd mistake. Maybe it is simply a typographical oversight -- albeit one that is duplicated in several places (pp. 1, 2, 4, 37). Anyway, someone who does not know better would be led astray.

§1.2 of Chapter One is entitled "Linguistic Idealism." Here Barber aims to explain why McDowell thinks that Brandom's view of meaning cuts language off from the world, and what Brandom's reply is. But he tries to do so without first explaining what it is about Brandom's view that would provoke such a worry (p. 4). He has only told us that Brandom is an inferentialist, not a representationalist, and that McDowell thinks Brandom appeals to a false dichotomy. Barber needs to say more. Specifically, Brandom holds that linguistic meaning should be understood in terms of "proprieties" of inferring. Roughly, the root idea is that the meaning of a sentence should be explained in terms of what it can be rightly inferred from, and what can be rightly inferred from it. For instance, from 'That is crimson' one could rightly infer 'That is red,' from which one could rightly infer 'That is colored.' The proprieties of those inferences partly explain what 'That is red' means. However, if the meaning of our words consists solely in the propriety of "moves" from one use of words to another, then meaning would seem not to concern the connection between words and the world, i.e., between 'red' and redness; it would concern only connections between words and words. And that threatens to leave it mysterious how words manage to be about the world at all.

Although Barber does not mention it initially (pp. 4-6), Brandom anticipates this worry and develops his view in light of it; McDowell himself does not introduce it.[5]Brandom's response is to broaden our idea of inference. The resulting view he calls "strong inferentialism." Roughly, he proposes that just as a claim can be rationally supported by another claim, so too can a claim be rationally supported by an observation. For instance, the claim 'That is red' can be supported by seeing something red. And just as a claim can support another claim, so too can a claim support a deliberate action. For instance, 'That is a tomato' can, in the right circumstances (e.g., wanting a tomato), support an act of reaching for a tomato. Because strong inferentialism holds that the meaning of words is partly constituted by proprieties concerning words and non-verbal happenings (observation and action), it does not leave it mysterious how words manage to be about the world at all. Barber doesn't spell that out clearly.

That is where McDowell's charge of "idealism" arises; it specifically concerns Brandom's "two-ply" view of observation and observational knowledge.[6] While Barber does try to explain Brandom's view, he does not emphasize that Brandom's analysis of observation has this "two-ply" character, nor does he explain Brandom's reasons for holding it.[7]

What is Brandom's view of observation? He holds that observation requires "reliable differential responsive dispositions." That is, an observer must be able to respond reliably and differentially to stimuli. For instance, to be able to observe a red tomato, one must be able to respond reliably to red tomatoes in one's vicinity. Brandom stresses that such reliable responsiveness does not suffice for observation. For instance, a piece of iron will reliably rust in the presence of moisture, but it does not observe moisture. So, "reliable differential responsive dispositions" are only the "first ply" of observation. For Brandom, although the iron responds reliably to the moisture, it does not observe moisture because its response to the moisture (rusting) is not of the right sort. He holds that a response needs to be conceptual for it to count as an observation. What makes a response conceptual? Brandom holds that the responder must grasp what the response rationally supports and is supported by. For instance, an encounter with a red tomato might provoke me to say, 'That's red.' For that response to count as an observation, I must grasp that it would be supported by a claim like 'That's maroon,' and that it would support a claim like 'That's colored.' Thus, for Brandom, the "second ply" of observation is that the response must be "inferentially articulated;" the responder must grasp what his response supports and is supported by. While the response must be "inferentially articulated," it need not be the result of an inference or a piece of reasoning. So, Brandom holds that an observation is a non-inferential, conceptual ("inferentially articulated") response to a stimulus.

Not only could Barber be clearer about Brandom's "two-ply" view of perception, but in several places, Barber overlooks a key part of Brandom's view of perceptualknowledge. Specifically, he does not mention that Brandom distinguishes between attributing belief and justification ("commitment and entitlement") and the propriety or correctness of such attributions. He glosses Brandom's view on perceptual knowledge in terms like these: "there can be no perception until . . . [an] interpreter endorses a reporter's or responder's perceptual claim" (15).[8] That gloss conflates Brandom's view on perceptual knowledge-attributions with his view on perceptual knowledge. For Brandom, perceptual knowledge does not require that someone else actually "endorses" the perceiver's claim; rather, it must simply be appropriate or correct for one to "endorse" it.

To see why, let me give a short sketch of Brandom's view. Brandom puts a twist on the "standard analysis of knowledge," according to which knowledge is justified, true belief.[9] He focuses first on what we are doing when we attribute propositional knowledge to someone. Suppose I say that Sarah knows that the tomato is red. For Brandom, I thereby attribute to her a "commitment" to the claim that the tomato is red, as well as an "entitlement" to that claim. To be "committed" and "entitled" to the claim means roughly that she is rationally obliged to have reasons for that claim, and that she has such reasons available to her. Crucially, in saying that Sarah knows that the tomato is red, I too undertake a commitment to that very same claim; I myself adopt the burden of having reasons for it. That is Brandom's way of spelling out the "truth" condition in the standard analysis. That, in brief, is Brandom's view of knowledge-attributions. He moves from there to a view about knowledge. Roughly, he holds that for S to know that p is for it to be appropriate or correct for one to attribute belief in and justification for p to S, while believing p oneself.[10]

For Brandom, to say that someone has observational or perceptual knowledge -- to say, for instance, that Sarah sees that the tomato is red -- is to remark on both her belief and her justification. It is to say that the belief resulted from the exercise of a reliable differential responsive disposition and is thereby warranted.[11] In turn, for S to have observational knowledge that p is for it to be appropriate or correct to attribute to S a reliably formed belief that p, while believing p oneself. That distinction Barber overlooks.

Although Barber is inaccurate and unclear about Brandom's and McDowell's views in key places, one might think he nevertheless has something important to say about what phenomenology can teach them. Unfortunately, here too Barber disappoints.

To be sure, Barber does state several lessons that he thinks phenomenology has to teach Brandom or McDowell. Specifically, Barber says that McDowell's defense of realism could be made stronger by a fuller conception of perception (as developed by A.D. Smith and Husserl) (ch. 3); Brandom's view of the importance of intersubjectivity for understanding knowledge is similar to Levinas's view (ch. 4); McDowell's defense of "common sense" should be clearer about the distinctive philosophical position from which it is made (ch. 5); Brandom's meta-philosophy should take better account of the "lifeworld" in which linguistic practice is rooted (ch. 6); and McDowell's ethics could take better account of our encounters with others, à la Levinas (ch. 7).

What holds these individual lessons together? What "big lessons" does phenomenology have to teach Brandom and McDowell? Barber never tells us. Without that, it is easy for readers to get lost as they try to make their way through the book. On the face of it, none of these individual lessons strikes at the heart of Brandom's or McDowell's views. Perhaps Barber thinks there are no big lessons, just little ones. But then I wonder why he has bothered to write this book.

One thing would have made a big difference: Barber should have explained what philosophically unites Brandom and McDowell. That would have helped him frame his whole attempt to explain what big lessons phenomenology has to teach them. Barber mentions one commonality: they, like Sellars and Hegel, reject "the given" (ix). But he only mentions this and doesn't use it to anchor his discussion. And there are many other things that seem to unite them: interest in human practice, concern with "the space of reasons", emphasis on norms, resistance to certain sorts of reductive naturalism. Barber could have used any one of these as his anchor, but he doesn't. That makes the preface particularly maddening and it makes it hard for the reader to know where the book is headed at any given point. Of course, Barber might think that nothing much unites them, but that is a point I'd like to see carefully developed and defended, not simply ignored. If Barber had identified commitments shared by Brandom and McDowell, he could have more easily said how phenomenology subverts them or extends them or provides distinctive support for them.

While Barber's aim in this book is philosophically interesting, the result is disappointing. That is not totally surprising, given how ambitious an aim it is. Alas, we must await a book that does a better job of it.[12]

[1] Barber mentions John Haugeland (x). A colleague of Brandom's and McDowell's for many years at the University of Pittsburgh, Haugeland had a career-long interest in Heidegger's Being and Time. Although they cite Haugeland in many places, his influence on them was more pervasive than those citations can suggest. Likewise, Haugeland cites Brandom and McDowell in many places, but those citations potentially under-represent their influence on his thinking. In any case, for some representative work, see Haugeland, Having Thought (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1998) and Haugeland, "Authentic Intentionality" in M. Scheutz, Computationalism: New Directions (Cambridge, MA: MIT, 2002). For other work that engages Brandom and McDowell from a broadly phenomenological point of view, but which is not mentioned by Barber, see R. Kukla, "Myth, Memory and Misrecognition in Sellars's 'Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind,' Philosophical Studies, 101 (2000): 161-211; S. Kelly, "Demonstrative Concepts and Experience," The Philosophical Review, 110.3 (2001): 397-420; J. Rouse, How Scientific Practices Matter (Chicago: University of Chicago, 2003); H. Dreyfus, "Overcoming the Myth of the Mental," Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association, 79.2 (2005); and R. Kukla & M. Lance, Yo! and Lo! (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2009).

[2] For helpful discussion, see M. Kremer, "Representation or Inference?" and J. MacFarlane, "Pragmatism and Inferentialism" in J. Wanderer, B. Weiss (eds.), Reading Brandom (New York: Routledge, 2010).

[3] See, for instance, Brandom, Making it Explicit (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1994), ch. 2.

[4] For McDowell's most recent and fullest statement of his worries, see "Motivating Inferentialism," in McDowell, The Engaged Intellect (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2008), pp. 288-307. That essay is not cited by Barber.

[5] On p. 7, Barber mentions it in passing.

[6] I won't be able to discuss McDowell's objections here. For his most recent statement of them, see "Brandom on Observation," in Reading Brandom. Barber does not cite that essay.

[7] Barber's clearest formulations of Brandom's view are on p. 6 and p. 12. Strangely, Barber never cites what might be Brandom's clearest statement of the view: "The Centrality of Sellars's Two-Ply Account of Observation," in Brandom, Tales of the Mighty Dead (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2002).

[8] For instance, pp. 7, 9, 43, 94, 122.

[9] See, for instance, (Brandom, 1994, pp. 201-204).

[10] Brandom refers to that sort of view as "normative phenomenalism" (1994, p. 627).

[11] Brandom, 1994, pp. 217-227.

[12] I'm grateful to Zed Adams, Susan Feldman and Nat Hansen for helpful suggestions and comments.