The Intrinsic Worth of Persons: Contractarianism in Moral and Political Philosophy

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Jean Hampton, The Intrinsic Worth of Persons: Contractarianism in Moral and Political Philosophy, Daniel Farnham (ed.), Cambridge University Press, 2007, 223pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521673259.

Reviewed by Matt Matravers, University of York


The Intrinsic Worth of Persons brings together a selection of some of the late Jean Hampton's published essays on moral, legal, and political philosophy, which given her philosophical talents, are also some of the most interesting papers of recent years.

The collection begins with a brief foreword by David Gauthier, in which he picks out some of the essential themes of the essays that follow, and raises some questions about them. The first essay is "Feminist Contractarianism" in which Hampton asks whether it is possible to be both a feminist and a contractarian. One of the particular pleasures of reading Hampton is that even her asides and introductions contain pithy, interesting, and often provocative claims. This essay is no exception; before the argument has really got going, the reader is invited to consider what's wrong with some aspects of the ethics of care -- particularly its relation to Kohlberg's experiments -- and with the contractarianism of Hobbes and Kant. What Hampton takes from Hobbes is the idea that it is legitimate to have an interest in oneself, from Kant that we need to respect the intrinsic worth of persons. These she combines in a Kantian (of sorts) contractarianism in which "'being just' in a distributive sense means 'distributing benefits and burdens in a relationship such that each person's worth is properly respected'" (31). Thus, one can not only be both a contractarian and a feminist, but contractarianism can illuminate what is wrong in exploitative relationships in which, perhaps under the guise of affection, one party is doing all the work and the other reaping all the benefits.

This concern for self-sacrifice is the theme of the next essay, "Selflessness and Loss of Self", in which Hampton questions the virtue of selflessness and the vice of selfishness. The essay is set up in much the same way as the first (indeed, there is quite a bit of repetition in the opening sections): morality, on the one hand, has surely gone wrong if it demands that we always show concern for others and sacrifice our own interests to satisfy those of others. On the other hand, it is hardly satisfactory to say that we can do as we like with the only moral constraint being not to injure those whom we happen across as we pursue our self-gratification. That is to say, a self-sacrificing concern for others is not morally valuable if it fails to "leave room" (51) for the proper development of one's self. Indeed, since the proper development of one's self is a moral requirement, unbalanced self-sacrifice is a moral wrong. What it is to be a "moral respecter" of yourself is to have a proper sense of your own "intrinsic and equal value as a human being"; of what you "require, as a human being, to flourish"; and "of what you require" to flourish as the particular person that you are (51). However, Hampton argues, we do not simply pick and choose what we require unconstrained. Instead, she offers a (sketchy) Aristotelian account of what it is to make authentic choices. To be authentic, our choices have to be both "consistent with what we take to be the objectively defined needs of human persons" (58) and such as to leave room for "self-expressing and self-defining activities" (59). This allows Hampton to distinguish between the exploited and the authentic carer, although as she notes such a distinction is easier on paper than in practice.

The third and fourth essays deal with legal philosophy: specifically, with mens rea and punishment. In "Mens Rea", Hampton offers an account of legal culpability by first working through what she calls "rational" and "moral" culpability. Underpinning all of these is the idea that the culpable individual defies authority; whether that authority belongs to reason, morality, or the law. This account of akratic behaviour is clearest, although perhaps no less controversial, in the case of reason. Often we know -- reason tells us -- that we ought to do a certain thing (for example, not drink too much at dinner if we have to be awake and capable early in the morning to lecture). Given that we want to be clear-headed, there is only one rational course of action. Yet, we do not take it. The phrase "weakness of will" suggests that we are too weak to obey reason's command in the face of our desire for another glass of pinot noir. But, according to Hampton, this is a misdescription. Far from being the result of weakness in any ordinary sense, the extra glass is a manifestation of a hubristic claim that (just this once) the world will not be as predicted by reason; we will have some more wine, and we will nevertheless wake bright and cheery in the morning. We defy the authority of reason and substitute in its place the authority of desire.

If the authority of morality derives from that of reason -- for example, if moral imperatives bind only because they advance the interests of those subject to them -- then this account will do for moral authority and moral defiance, too. If not, then for the structure of the account of culpability to remain the same, Hampton must posit or presume a robust account of the authority of morality. The defiant person can then be blamed for her defiance and what makes that blame appropriate is "the choice to install as authoritative something that condones what she wishes to do, rather than allow the relevant authoritative moral command to prevail" (93). Of course, whereas the defiance of reason is usually self-defeating, it is an open (and much discussed) question whether defiance in the face of the authority of morality is bound to fail.

This account translates easily to legal authority, but as in the moral case, will vary depending on one's account of legal authority. The law, then, will look for signs of a "defiant mind" in the actions of the accused: for example, knowledge and intent (102), and should excuse where there is absence of such defiance: for example, in cases of genuine and non-culpable ignorance.

In the next essay, "Righting Wrongs: The Goal of Retribution", Hampton's concern with the intrinsic value of persons and with hubristic defiance comes together in a partial justification of punishment. Critical to this is an account of moral injury. A moral injury occurs when a person's value is diminished by another's immoral behaviour that renders the victim unable to secure "that to which his value entitles him" and/or conveys the message that the victim is of far less than his actual value (126). The correct response to such an injury is retribution, which includes but is not limited to, punishment. A retributive response is "intended to vindicate the value of the victim" by "repudiating [the injury's] message of superiority over the victim but does so in a way that confirms them as equal by virtue of their humanity" (135). Quite how this should be done, and how it connects to penal hard treatment, is a difficult issue about which Hampton makes a number of suggestive comments.

Given Hampton's morally rich theory of punishment, she requires the State to give public expression to certain substantive moral values. This, as she notes, runs contrary to one recent trend in liberal theory that tries to minimize the moral commitments of the State in response to the fact of reasonable pluralism. It is this trend, as exemplified by Rawls's Political Liberalism, that is the target in the next essay "The Common Faith of Liberalism". Hampton argues that Rawls not only must, but in fact does, endorse an Enlightenment faith in the power of reason. One of the more interesting aspects of this argument is the claim that far from being more pluralist and tolerant, Rawls's eschewal of the power of reason in favour of a more blurred idea of "reasonableness" may turn out to provide ammunition for an imperialist, intolerant liberalism (176-9).

The final essay in the collection is "The Contractarian Explanation of the State" in which Hampton takes on three big questions: "How do governments originate?"; "How are they maintained?"; and "What is a state?". As is suggested by the title, Hampton takes an unfashionable approach -- even for contractarians -- to these questions, and argues for a contractarian "causal account of the state's creation and maintenance" (186). However, this terminology is deceptive as Hampton's "contractarianism" is, as she readily admits, a form of coordination (or convention building). The state comes into being (rules and rulers are created) and is continued (rules and rulers are obeyed) in order to solve not a prisoner's dilemma, but a coordination ("battle of the sexes") game.

As I noted at the beginning, each of these essays is interesting and philosophically suggestive. However, the purpose of bringing them together is unclear. They are not particularly inaccessible as individual pieces and, despite the subtitle, only two of the essays really deal with contractarianism in political philosophy. Moreover, it is arguable that Hampton's best essay on that subject is not included ("Two Faces of Contractarian Thought" in P. Vallentyne, ed., Contractarianism and Rational Choice: Essays on Gauthier. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press). The critical test for any selected papers, I suppose, is whether the whole is greater than the sum of the parts. It this case it is, but for a slightly unusual reason. Normally, selected papers read together satisfy this test by developing a coherent view on a particular subject; each essay contributing something additional to the overall position. That is not the case here. Rather, what these essays contain (as Gauthier points out in the Foreword) is a repeated attempt to bring together a form of moral absolutism (as is in evidence in Hampton's sympathy with Kant, Rawls, the intrinsic worth of persons, and the authority of both reason and morality) with a Hobbesian perspective that is entirely hostile to this idea. This, of course, would be a neat trick if it could be done. I do not think Hampton succeeds in these essays, but it is philosophically pleasurable, challenging, and rewarding to watch her try.