The Kantian Legacy in Nineteenth Century Science

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Michael Friedman and Alfred Nordmann (eds.), The Kantian Legacy in Nineteenth Century Science, MIT Press, 2006, 370pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0262062542.

Reviewed by Martin Schönfeld, University of South Florida


The handbook is about Kant's varied influences on scientific progress in the nineteenth century.  The fourteen texts in this collection are well-informed, richly documented, and carefully argued.  Overall, this reader is a useful data bank, and the authors engage with interesting questions.  How fruitful, actually, are Kant's philosophical views?  And what is their scientific relevance?

Applied to nineteenth century science, the pursuit of these questions yields thought-provoking results.  The authors examine scientific, intellectual, and philosophical developments in the time roughly from Kant's death (1804) through the nineteenth century up to the early twentieth century.  They look at innovations and progressions in pre-Darwinian evolutionary biology and morphology (Goethe), in cognitive physiology (Helmholtz), mathematics (Poincaré), and in physics (Hertz).  They also explore Kant's impact on the romantics (e.g. Schiller, Schelling, or Hegel), on the Neo-Kantians (here: Riehl, Cohen, Fries), on logical positivism (Schlick), and on pragmatism (Peirce).

Kantian ideas radiated across the disciplines and affected all the fields and figures mentioned.  This result, as such, is not surprising.  Kant engaged with the Enlightenment idea of progress.  His work left marks, and his legacy informed subsequent progress.  What is surprising is that the ideas that did cross interdisciplinary boundaries and that did push the envelope of knowledge were Kant's "crazy" ideas -- the notion of the synthetic a priori; the claim of pure spatiotemporal intuition, and the strange pre-critical method of analogy.  It turns out that these ideas informed scientific progress in the nineteenth century.  Since scientific progressions in that era were clearly substantial, and since they apparently built on just these ideas, the research gathered here confronts readers with a provocative outcome: it seems Kant was on to something after all.

Put differently and placed in context, most philosophers today, whether of continental or analytic persuasion, are skeptics about some of Kant's core philosophical teachings.  We tend to regard Kant's synthetic a priori and its ontological baggage as relics of a bygone age.  With the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant tried to work out how metaphysics can become scientific; he thought solving this puzzle means to grasp how it is possible for synthetic propositions to be a priori, and he saw arithmetic and geometry as progressive synthetic a priori fields.  Mathematics expands knowledge, so it is synthetic; and it does so by pure intuition without use of material perception, and so it is a priori.  Einstein rejected Kant's view with the famous dictum, "As far as the laws of mathematics refer to reality, they are not certain; and as far as they are certain, they do not refer to reality."[1]  Contra Kant, it would appear that the synthetic a priori is pure fancy, which is false at best and absurd at worst.  Following Einstein, mathematics seems to be either pure or applied; if it is the former, it will be a priori and tautological, without involving what Kant called intuition (Anschauung), and if it is the latter, it will be synthetic and empirical, by means of connecting formal axioms to specific material interpretations.  Or so we believe today.  But if Einstein and his skeptical followers were right, how would we explain that the synthetic a priori is meaningless, as they say, and yet has served to inform scientific progress?  How can a notion be meaningless, false, or absurd, when it is evidently fertile and heuristically successful?

The editors acknowledge, in the introduction (p. 4), some ironies in Kant's scientific legacy.  One irony is that "the logical empiricist movement of the early twentieth century conceived itself as a new scientific philosophy … and at the same time took Poincaré (along with Helmholtz) as one of its main sources of … inspiration".  Poincaré and Helmholtz put the idea of the synthetic a priori to good use.  It is ironic that the logical empiricists are taken to have left Kant's crazy idea behind and yet built on this very platform by appropriating innovations of those who worked with this notion.  At any rate, the editors make it clear that understanding nineteenth century scientific progress, the transition from Newton to Einstein, requires adding Kant to the historical equation.  Considering this, one might add that modern science does not rely on the Scottish Enlightenment as much as Anglophone scholars like to believe; via Kant, the Eurasian Enlightenment is its other source.

F. Beiser, in "Kant and Naturphilosophie," investigates the organic concept of nature as found in romantic naturalists and idealists like Schelling or Hegel.  For Neo-Kantians, the organic concept of the romantics was ill-conceived, since the romantics ignored the regulative constraints that the critical Kant put on teleology.  Neo-Kantians faulted romantics for a priori systematizing and employing analogies, although the romantics learned doing so from Kant, especially from his second book, Universal Natural History (1755).  Beiser notes (p. 9) that in terms of historical influence the regulative doctrine is overrated, since the organic concept, constitutively understood, and filled with living forces or vital powers, was the heuristic basis of innovations in physiology and biology in the eighteenth and early nineteenth centuries.  Beiser concludes that the constitutive organic concept of the pre-critical Kant and his romantic students is more than naïve speculation (p. 24).

R. Richards, in "Nature is the Poetry of the Mind," describes Goethe's reception of Kant, his orientation on Spinoza and Schelling, and his contributions to evolutionary biology, which were already seen by Helmholtz (p. 28).  As Richards points out, Goethe was convinced that "archetypes of plants and animals … animated nature" (p. 29).  One could add that while Goethe's conviction sounds exotic to Anglophone ears, this view spread in the continental Enlightenment, resurfaced in Schopenhauer and later in Jung, and is a characteristic tenet of Eurasian paganism.  In contrast to the critical Kant, who wanted to reduce scientific explanations to the mechanical, Goethe insisted on the scientific function of the concept of life. The account of Goethe's text on morphology (1790-1796 and 1817-1824, cf. pp. 32-34 and 45f.) in Richard's article is interesting.  These texts anticipated key elements of evolutionary biology long before Darwin's 1858 work.  The anticipations turn on the heuristic idea of "two evolutionary series -- of the self and of nature," which Goethe learned from Schelling (p. 47).  One could add that Schelling learned it from Kant (1755), who appropriated it, in turn, from the introductory remarks of Wolff's China-speech (1726).

M. Friedman's "Kant -- Naturphilosophie -- Electromagnetism" is the third paper on the scientific aspects of romantic or idealistic naturalism, and it gives yet another illustration of the role of odd heuristic ideas in scientific progressions.  Maxwell's and Einstein's findings would not have been possible without Oersted's 1819 discovery of the connection between electricity and magnetism, and Oersted's discovery, in turn, would have been impossible without the motivation provided by Schelling's Naturphilosophie -- Schelling made Oersted ask the right questions.  Friedman pits his account of Kant, Schelling, and Oersted against an earlier analysis by L. Pearce Williams (1966).  Pearce Williams had portrayed Kant as a critic of Newton's natural philosophy.  Friedman, by contrast, argues that "Kant's philosophy of nature … should rather be viewed as a culmination of the Newtonian tradition" (p. 52).  Friedman concludes that Schelling's ideas were responses to tensions in Kant, and that a new speculative perspective such as Schelling's was just what was needed then, as Oersted's spectacular discovery confirms (p. 68).  Friedman's interpretation is coherent as long as one equates Kant with the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science (1786).  But it is a bit doubtful in light of Kant's own holistic, partly anti-Newtonian naturalism (1745-1759).  Given Kant's early naturalism and its influence on the romantics, Schelling's perspective appears less as a "new" (p. 68) philosophy of nature, and more as a continuation of Kant's early work.

The papers by Gregory and Pulte focus on a little-known Kantian thinker, Fries, whose philosophy of science engaged with Kant's ideas on mathematics, and occupies a middle-ground between romantic Naturphilosophie and Neo-Kantianism.  F. Gregory, in "Extending Kant," describes context and aspects of Fries' thought. Anticipating logical empiricists, Fries combined his respect for mathematics with "a recognition of the fundamental yet problematical role of empirical observation" (p. 87).  Experience was Fries' starting point and main problem -- as Lakatos and Popper already noticed, Fries was the first to deny that one can prove a statement by appeal to a perceptual experience (p. 95).  H. Pulte, in "Kant, Fries, and the Expanding Universe of Science," presents an excellent sketch of the worsening relationship of philosophy and science in the nineteenth century (p. 101).  The growing mutual estrangement inspired the creation of a philosophy of science, promoted by scientists such as Mach, Helmholtz, Boltzmann, and Hertz, and pioneered by Fries.  Fries hoped to keep science and philosophy together through a 'dynamized' Kantianism, which "integrates post-Kantian developments in mathematics and the natural sciences without giving up Kant's principal aim of a transcendental foundation for all scientific knowledge" (ibid.).  Fries expanded Kant's narrow critical view of science; he weakened, empirically, the demand for systematicity, and he blurred the regulative and constitutive functions of heuristic maxims (p. 110).  Pulte concludes his appraisal by contrasting Fries' marginalized historical role with his philosophical achievements.

The papers by DiSalle and Lenoir concern Kant's impact on Helmholtz.  R. DiSalle, in "Kant, Helmholtz, and the Meaning of Empiricism," explores what Helmholtz called "the facts that lie at the foundation of geometry" and that Kant called the synthetic a priori (p. 125).  Helmholtz was a Kantian who suggested an empiricist defense of the privileged position of Euclidean geometry, as the intuitive basis on which various non-Euclidean geometries may be constructed (p. 124).  DiSalle points out how Helmholtz saves the idea of pure intuition in its constructivist sense, and that he goes a step further than Kant by grounding this idea in a principle of free mobility (p. 138).  Helmholtz's philosophy of geometry amounts to a step from Kant toward Poincaré and Einstein.

T. Lenoir, in "Operationalizing Kant," gives a detailed, seventy-page long account of Helmholtz's work in cognitive physiology.  Like any reader of Kant's Critique, Helmholtz wondered about the connection of mental representations of external objects to the mind-independent things as such.  Unlike most readers, he proceeded to answer this question experimentally.  Inspired by the new telegraph technology, he built various machines that modeled aspects of hearing and seeing.  Proceeding from Herbart (Kant's successor at Königsberg) and the idea of n-fold aggregates as the calculus of data-processing, Helmholtz found convergent cognitive structures of ear and eye.  For the Kantian legacy in nineteenth century science, three items matter.  First, "understood as the abstract space of n-dimensional manifolds emptied of all content, Kant's notion of space as the transcendental form of intuition was a powerful stimulus both to scientific geometry and to psychophysical research" (p. 205).  Second, n-fold aggregates allowed the construction of "the mental machinery for relationships that are necessary, valid, prior to all experience, and at the same time related to the world of outer sense" (p. 202).  And third, the metaphor of the telegraph worked for sensory physiology by explaining the curious analogy between the Young hypothesis for color vision and Helmholtz's model for hearing (p. 204).  The last point is interesting: Lenoir engages with the role of analogies in Helmholtz's advances in cognitive physiology -- the very method that inspired the romantics, that stimulated progress, and that comes from the early Kant.

The next group of papers, by Richardson, Heidelberger, and Nordmann, concerns Kant's legacy in the Marburg School, and the connections from Marburg Neo-Kantians to the logical positivists and the pragmatists in the early twentieth century.  Here the attention turns toward epistemology and philosophy of science.  A. Richardson, in "Exact Science as Problem and Resource in Marburg Neo-Kantianism," maps out the trajectories from Kant to Cohen to Carnap; M. Heidelberger, in "Kantianism and Realism," traces the links from Kant to Riehl to Schlick, and A. Nordmann, in "Critical Realism, Critical Idealism, and Critical Common-Sensism," explores the philosophical sequence from Kant to Riehl/Cohen and to Peirce.  There is a wealth of useful information in all three papers, but this reviewer disliked the tenor of that group as a tad too ideological.  The authors shake their heads at the "excesses of systematic philosophy in the German Idealist tradition" (p. 217), which are, to wit, "the excesses of German idealism and of Hegelianism" (p. 249).  Kant's suggestion of collapsing mental and physical phenomena in the same substratum (1781 A385-387) is labeled as "psychophysical parallelism" (p. 238) -- wouldn't it be easier to call it 'holism' or 'naturalism'?  Striking a tough-minded pose, the authors approve of Schlick's elimination of Riehl's a priori as an "essential correction" (p. 245); and in the end, next to the path from Kant to pragmatism (which has been shown elsewhere),[2] the portrait of Peirce closes, in the American spirit of our times, with the Bible as "highest existing authority" (p. 270).

The final set of articles, by Folina, Gray, and Lützen, is about Poincaré and Hertz, with a focus on mathematics and physics.  J. Folina, in "Poincaré's Circularity Arguments," describes Poincaré's view that mathematical derivations always presuppose some mathematics and not just logic, and that what is presupposed is not arbitrary but instead intuitive, which means that it is built into the nature of finite minds (p. 275).  Like Kant, Poincaré held that "significant mathematics is synthetic a priori because it ultimately involves a priori intuition" (ibid.; the idea is that arithmetic turns on the intuition of time).  Folina explains Poincaré's arguments and analyzes the critique by W. Goldfarb (1988), according to which Poincaré's arguments fail by being psychologistic.  In a brief but intriguing digression, Folina points out the links among the charges of psychologism, of the naturalistic fallacy, and of the fact-value distinction (p. 287-288).  These charges Folina calls, not without justice, "philosophical tricks" (ibid.), and persuasively defends Poincaré's conception of arithmetic as a coherent and updated version of Kantianism.

J. Gray, in "Poincaré -- between Physics and Philosophy," returns to the motif of analogy as "the only way forward" according to Poincaré (p. 296), and details his conventionalist conception of geometry.  Gray shows that the synthetic a priori "was rejected for geometry but retained for arithmetic because there are many geometries but only one arithmetic" (p. 312).  Poincaré's thoughts on geometry are fascinating and profound, but it appears to this reviewer that Poincaré made a mistake.  According to Gray (p. 307), Poincaré thought that our knowledge is of bodies and their behavior, and that space is a hypothetical construct.  This does not seem right, because animals such as mammals and birds operate with an elementary knowledge not only of bodies, but also of space -- just think of territories, migrations, or, most clearly, the three-dimensional flight zones (Fluchtdistanz) surrounding an animal, which will trigger escape behavior when breached.  If Poincaré were right, and space was indeed a hypothetical construct beyond elementary knowledge, flight zones of nonhumans (incapable of hypothetical constructs) would not exist.

J. Lützen rounds off the collection with "Images and Conventions," an account of Kantianism, empiricism, and conventionalism in Hertz's and Poincaré's philosophies of space and mechanics.  This is an informative, well-reasoned comparison of Hertz and Poincaré, even if Lützen finds it necessary to deplore the "remarkable shortcomings" of both thinkers, shortcomings he blames on Kant (p. 328).

This handbook is a valuable collection with surprising results and thought-provoking implications.  It turns out that progressions of nineteenth century science were indebted to Kant and that his notion of the synthetic a priori, the concept of the organic, and the method of analogy were of considerable heuristic utility in making these progressions possible.  This outcome, and its reasons, which are detailed in this collection, deserve attention.  ("Analogy" is not listed in the index; relevant would be pp. 9, 179, 185, 190, 194, 203f, 299, 296f.)  The information in this collection about the characteristic Kantian and continental legacy in nineteenth century science, and the stark contrast to Newtonian and Scottish perspectives, should also be of interest to comparative scholars inquiring about the naturalistic ontologies of the Eurasian Enlightenment.

The only weakness this reviewer finds is the nearly complete absence of any discussion of Kant's own Naturphilosophie, in particular, the glaring omission of Kant's Universal Natural History and Theory of the Skies (1755 -- mentioned only by F. Beiser).  This somewhat embarrassing neglect, which is idiosyncratic of Anglophone scholarship -- the book has never come out, in full, in English, and it is not in the Cambridge Kant Edition either -- is all the more curious since cosmologists today assess Universal Natural History as "the essence" of the standard models.[3]  In the nineteenth century, Kant's second book inspired Goethe, Schopenhauer, and Nietzsche alike, and its model of natural evolution raises the question of whether and if so, how, Darwin learned from it.  In the eighteenth century, Kant had to publish it anonymously, and it damaged and delayed his career, irritating dualists, creationists, and skeptics alike.  It is time to get over it and to fill this lacuna.

[1] Albert Einstein, Sidelights on Relativity (London: Methuen, 1922), p. 28; orig. p. in Einstein, "Geometrie und Erfahrung," Sitzungsberichte der Preussischen Akademie der Wissenschaften: Physikalisch-mathematische Klasse (Berlin, 1921), p. 124.  Compare also Michael Friedman, Kant and the Exact Sciences (Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1992), 55-56, and see J. Lützen, "Images and Conventions," p. 321, in the volume reviewed.

[2] Sidney Axinn, ""The First Western Pragmatist: Immanuel Kant," Journal of Chinese Philosophy 33 (2006): 83-92 (Special Issue: Kant and Confucianism)

[3] On Universal Natural History capturing "the essence of modern models," see Peter Coles, ed., Companion to the New Cosmology (London: Routledge, 2001), "Key Themes and Major Figures," entry on Kant, p. 240-241.  Universal Natural History was first published anonymously in Königsberg and Leipzig 1755, and appeared six more times in Kant's lifetime.  It has been translated into English only once (1900, tr. W. Hastie; 1968, rev. tr. W. Ley; 1969, reprint ed. M. K. Munitz), but characteristically, Kant's core account of natural evolution (chapter ii.8 and part iii; cf. Werke 1:323-368) was omitted.