The Kantian Sublime and the Revelation of Freedom

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Robert R. Clewis, The Kantian Sublime and the Revelation of Freedom, Cambridge UP, 2009, 258pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521516686.

Reviewed by Lara Osteric, St. Michael's College



Clewis’s book The Kantian Sublime and the Revelation of Freedom presents a new challenge for those who criticize Kant’s moral theory for its “rigor” and its insufficient recognition of the relevance of sensibility and emotions in human moral life. While being, as he himself admits, less interested in the logical features of the judgment of the sublime, Clewis examines how the feeling of the sublime and aesthetic enthusiasm share phenomenological and structural affinities with the moral feeling of respect, and thus prepare us for the exercise of our moral agency.

Clewis also reconsiders the widely accepted typology of the Kantian sublime, its standard division into the “mathematical” and “dynamical” sublime, and suggests that there is a third type of the sublime, namely, the “moral sublime”. By the moral sublime Clewis understands the effect on consciousness that the realization of the moral law has when observed aesthetically. On Clewis’s view, “aesthetic enthusiasm” is a subset of the moral sublime elicited by an empirical event that serves as a sign of a moral tendency of humanity. Clewis argues that aesthetic enthusiasm may help us understand better how Kant’s discussion of the sublime contributes to the central concern of the third Critique, that is, the so-called transition problem from freedom to nature. Thus, Clewis’s book attempts to show that for Kant the sublime does not only make us aware of our purposiveness as autonomous moral agents (i.e., our moral vocation), but also, just like aesthetic and teleological judgments, of nature’s purposiveness. Thus, I take it that Clewis’s book attempts to convince us that the sublime does not remain “a mere appendix” to Kant’s systematic interests in the third Critique as some commentators have argued.1

Finally, for Kant, the French Revolution is an example of a historical event that elicited aesthetic enthusiasm. Hence, Clewis considers the implications of his interpretation of aesthetic enthusiasm in Kant for better understanding of Kant’s views of the French Revolution.

Clewis’s book takes into account a number of Kant’s critical and also some pre-critical works and an extensive literature on the subject written in English and also French, German, and Italian. Clewis notes that Jean-François Lyotard’s work has already engaged with the notion of aesthetic enthusiasm in Kant and its relation to the sublime and the events in France. However, Clewis argues that Lyotard offers a post-modern interpretations of the Kantian sublime that downplays the role of reason in the sublime and, therefore, that Lyotard fails to properly address the ethical implications of the sublime in Kant’s philosophy (23). While Clewis’s critique of Lyotard may be accurate, Jean-Luc Nancy and Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe do not seem to share Lyotard’s post-modern penchant for irrationalism. Nancy’s discussion of the sublime as “the presentation of freedom”2 and Lacoue-Labarthe’s discussion of “the sublime truth”3 seem to address directly the author’s concern, and I am puzzled that their works were not included in the author’s extensive secondary literature.

The book is divided into seven chapters. In Chapter 1, "The Observations and the Remarks", Clewis examines sublimity, the moral feeling, and the conceptions of freedom and enthusiasm in Kant’s writings from the 1760s, more specifically, in Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and Sublime (1764) and the collection of notes Kant wrote shortly after the Observations, the Remarks (1764-6). Clewis’s outline of Kant’s pre-critical views on these issues is intended to help the reader understand better the origins of Kant’s more mature critical account as well as to show that in the pre-critical period Kant did not clearly distinguish between the moral feeling and the sublime. The latter I take is intended to strengthen the plausibility of Clewis’s argument that in the critical period the feeling of the sublime is at least analogous to the moral feeling and thus relevant for the exercise of our moral agency. In Chapter 1 Clewis also demonstrates that unlike aesthetic enthusiasm in the critical account, the enthusiasm in the pre-critical period is a passion, not an affect. This explains why in the pre-critical period enthusiasm leads to a practical determination of the will, while in the critical period, in addition to practical enthusiasm, Kant also acknowledges enthusiasm as a merely aesthetic response.

In Chapter 2, “The Judgment of the Sublime”, Clewis considers the following features of the judgment of sublimity: the relation of judgment and feeling, the division of the judgments of sublimity into dependent and free, the alleged “formlessness” of the sublime, and subreption. With respect to the issue of how the judgment of the sublime relates to the feeling of the sublime, Clewis contends that “the judgment of the sublime is based on the feeling rather than identical to it” (60). This account of the relation between judgment and feeling remains ambiguous and one would expect him to explain more precisely, that is, in terms of the basic logical features of the judgment of the sublime, how imagination leads the mind to entertain the supersensible substrate in a way that leads to a non-theoretical satisfaction of reason, and the feeling of sublime as its consequence. Clewis further demonstrates that on Kant’s view the judgments of the sublime, just like the judgments of beauty, can be both dependent and free and that the object that elicits the feeling of the sublime should be considered “formless” insofar as it lacks symmetry and harmony. The object capable of eliciting the sublime, however, has form insofar as it elicits imagination’s engagement with the idea of reason. Finally, with respect to subreption, Clewis engages Michelle Grier’s recent book on transcendental illusion but argues that the subreption of the sublime, unlike reason’s transcendental illusion, is not necessary. If the subreption of the sublime were necessary, then sublimity would not be capable of eliciting one’s awareness of freedom.

In the same chapter, having reviewed Kant’s more familiar accounts of the sublime, the mathematical and the dynamical sublime, Clewis discusses the moral sublime, that is, the subject’s aesthetic response to something that has a moral content. For example, a virtuous person, that is, a person who exemplifies the moral law, may be an object of the “moral sublime”. Clewis discusses some mental states (courageous affect, moral sadness, and aesthetic enthusiasm) as a subset of the moral sublime; he also discusses the negative counterpart of the sublime (the grotesque and the monstrous 115). These topics have thus far received little attention in the Kant literature. Finally, in the last section of the chapter, Clewis defends the view that both natural and artistic objects can elicit the sublime. Unfortunately, he does not address how, from the perspective of Kant’s production aesthetics, an artist can satisfy both the criteria of tasteful and sublime manner of presentation in one work of art (339).

In Chapter 3, “Moral Feeling and the Sublime”, Clewis argues that the sublime is analogous to the moral feeling of respect for the moral law although it is not identical to it. Hence, his interpretation of the sublime avoids two extremes: the moralization of the sublime (reducing of the sublime to the moral feeling) and aesthetization of the sublime (excessive emphasis on the function of imagination at the expense of downplaying the moral dimension of the sublime). Chapter 4, “Various Senses of Interest and Disinterest”, applies to the judgment of the sublime Kant’s already widely discussed claim that judgments of beauty are disinterested while at the same time they contribute to the interest of reason.

In Chapter 5, “Aesthetic Enthusiasm”, Clewis addresses some passages in Kant’s writings where aesthetic enthusiasm appears to be “morally ambiguous” because of its hampering effect on our deliberative rational capacities (178). Clewis convincingly argues that, according to Kant, aesthetic enthusiasm deserves its ambiguous moral status only when used to replace our moral principles, while as a form of the sublime, it instead supports morality. Furthermore, the author argues that aesthetic enthusiasm is a form of the judgment of the sublime, that it can be viewed as sharing the four moments of pure aesthetic judgment (disinterestedness, universality, subjective purposiveness, and necessity), and that a number of passages in Kant’s writings give us good reasons to view enthusiasm as the form of the sublime. He demonstrates why aesthetic enthusiasm cannot qualify as the judgment of the agreeable, beautiful, and a moral judgment about the good. But the reader would expect Clewis also to give a positive account, that is, to show why certain objects have a capacity to elicit this form of judgment (which is presumably an aesthetic response) as opposed to a simple moral approval.

I take it that the answer to this question is intimated in Chapter 6, “Enthusiasm for the Idea of a Republic”. In this chapter, Clewis argues that for Kant a republican constitution is an Idea of reason, an “archetype”, which governs our practical judgments regarding existing political arrangements but as an Idea of reason can never be fully realized in the sensible world. This is the place in the book where the reader expects Clewis to clarify why certain objects, or events in the world, have the capacity to elicit an aesthetic enthusiasm in lieu of a mere moral judgment and a moral approval. One would expect him to argue that the French Revolution and the founding of the French Republic is a significant historical event that, according to Kant, serves as a sign that it is possible to realize the highest good in the world. In other words, the founding of the French Republic serves as a sign that it is possible to realize a political system conducive to the development of individuals with a stable moral character and, thus, as a sign of hope that the realization of morality in the world is indeed possible. Instead of emphasizing that the object of aesthetic enthusiasm is a possible prospect of the actual realization of the highest good in the world, Clewis suggests that the object of aesthetic enthusiasm is the moral idea of the republic, leaving the reader puzzled as to why we do not experience aesthetic enthusiasm for other moral ideas that we all share at all times.

In the same chapter, Clewis, contrary to many other commentators, convincingly argues that we can make sense of Kant’s own enthusiasm for the French Revolution without accusing him of inconsistency or of folding to political pressure. In other words, the means to achieve the republican form of government are immoral for Kant but the morality and desirability of the end is uncontroversial (203). Finally, in the last chapter, the author offers a brief summary of the main points of the book and defends Kant’s attempt to ground the experience of the sublime on the notion of freedom.

In sum, Clewis’s book is a valuable contribution to our understanding of Kant’s notion of the sublime and its relation to morality. Nevertheless, what I took to be one of the major aims — i.e., to show that for Kant the sublime is as significant for the systematic aims of the third Critique as the judgment of beauty and teleological judgment — tends to be lost amongst much detailed analysis of the features of the sublime. Clewis’s discussion of the moral sublime and aesthetic enthusiasm gives important directions about how the judgments of the sublime may be viewed as contributing to our representations of nature as purposive for our final rational aims, i.e., morality. On this view, sublimity would not only serve as a reminder of our autonomous moral agency and our superiority to nature but also as a sign that nature is cooperative with our moral aims and, thus, as an encouragement to continue bringing the moral good into the world. But perhaps in order to demonstrate clearly the significance of the moral sublime and aesthetic enthusiasm for the systematic aims of the third Critique a more rigorous engagement with the logical as well as phenomenological features of these judgments may be necessary.

1 See Henry Allison, Kant’s Theory of Taste, Cambridge UP, Cambridge, 2001, 344.

2 See Jean-Luc Nancy, “The Sublime Offering”, in Of the Sublime: Presence in Question, SUNY Press, 1993, 28. But consider also Nancy’s The Inoperative Community (U of Minnesota Press, 1991) and his The Experience of Freedom (Stanford UP, 1993).

3 See Philippe Lacoue-Labarth, “The Sublime Truth”, in Of the Sublime, 71-108.