The Landscape of Humanity: Art, Culture, and Society

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Anthony O'Hear, The Landscape of Humanity: Art, Culture, and Society, Imprint Academic, 2008, 242pp., $34.90 (pbk), ISBN 9781845401122.

Reviewed by Ásta Kristjana Sveinsdóttir, San Francisco State University


This book is published in the series St Andrews Studies in Philosophy and Public Affairs, the aim of which is to advance the contributions of philosophy in the discussion of topics of interest to the general public. This is a laudable aim, and I, for one, wish that more of our philosophical energy was devoted to participating in public discourse. Quite appropriately, the essays in The Landscape of Humanity address a wide range of topics on the general themes of art, culture, and politics. It is the author's intention that the fifteen essays 'collectively develop a conception of human culture, which is humane and traditionalist, and which also sees within human experience pointers to a world beyond the material' (p. 1). Rather than stating his commitments clearly in the form of theses and arguing for them in a systematic manner, he allows a picture to emerge through the discussion of particular topics.

Let me begin by giving some sense of O'Hear's commitments within the realms of art and culture. O'Hear thinks that: evolutionary theory cannot explain art and aesthetic experience; beauty should be one of the main aims of art; the attempt to understand ourselves and our place in the world from our subjective point of view is at the heart of culture (this in stark contrast with the aims of science); censorship of the arts is counterproductive, but criteria for public funding of art could make appeal to public taste and decency; and artworks are essentially the products of human spirit and imagination, and could never be mechanically produced.

With regard to politics, O'Hear thinks that for a democracy to operate in an open and human way, there needs to be a sizable middle class committed to the traditions of liberty and humanity, which limits exporting Western democracy to places without these traditions; that a shared sense of tradition, in the manner envisioned by Oakeshott, is needed for the successful maintenance of the political realm; that more than Popperian openness is needed to hold a society together, and Popper's account needs to be amended with tradition playing a more prominent role.

As can be seen from the above lists (and the lists could be longer still), O'Hear casts his gaze far and wide. It may be inevitable, given the range of issues touched upon, that the broad strokes used leave a reader wanting a more detailed argument, a closer attention to fine-grained distinctions, and a more nuanced articulation of the author's vision. Let me give but two examples.

The first essay concerns the role of evolutionary theory in the explanation of human behavior and experience, especially aesthetic experience. O'Hear's discussion reaches the following dilemma: either art and aesthetic experience point to something that transcends the material and evolutionary theory cannot give us a full account of human life and experience, or else art is a purely human creation and aesthetic experience has no transcendent dimension, in which case, evolutionary theory should be able to explain art and aesthetic experience (p. 26). O'Hear is firmly committed to the former. But the two options are not exhaustive; for instance, aesthetic experience could have no transcendent dimension, yet evolutionary theory fall short of explaining art and aesthetic experience.

In another essay, "Kantian Disinterestedness", O'Hear argues that 'it is time to ditch the Kantian notion of disinterestedness as a mark of the aesthetic and to acknowledge the potential the aesthetic has for casting light -- or darkness -- over the whole landscape of human life' (p. 73). But surely having some role for Kantian disinterestedness in one's account of art and the aesthetic need not mean that the subject matter of art be limited to the object of the disinterested stance. Here a more nuanced account of the options is called for.

Given O'Hear's acknowledgement that art is properly concerned with the whole landscape of humanity and that the role of the aesthetic can be to cast light on this landscape, one might wonder on what grounds O'Hear so easily dismisses art that has overt political content (e.g. feminist, anti-racist, anti-heteronormative, etc.), which he does in "Art and Censorship" (pp. 104-109). O'Hear's view is that "doing dirt on life" cannot function as a serious political gesture. But why ever not? Is it a necessary condition of art that it be beautiful? That seems an indefensible position. Given that art may have a cognitive value and that in certain cases the way in which material is presented is what makes us see it (see it in a different way) or face the discomforts associated with it, then it follows that its "aesthetic badness" may be integral to the work's cognitive success. Here, as well as elsewhere in the book, the reader may want not only a more detailed discussion, but a discussion that integrates the various strands of O'Hear's humane traditionalism.

So, what does O'Hear's traditionalism consist in? As I said in the beginning, that is nowhere clearly stated, but it seems to me that he is committed to the claim that what is traditional, be it in the realm of arts, culture, or politics, is of value and should be upheld. Traditions are sets of practices, beliefs, insights, attitudes, and the like, as well as bodies of knowledge (p. 194). Why are traditions of value? Because they have stood the test of time? No, I don't think that is O'Hear's view. He is an objectivist, even a realist, about at least some kind of value (p. 120), so the picture is something like this: what makes traditions valuable is that they embody or further goals and pursuits that are inherently valuable. How do we know that our traditions do so? Answer: because they have stood the test of time. But in our times, this explanation simply won't do. In light of the fact that there are other competing explanations of why various traditions have stood the test of time besides their embodying or promoting something inherently valuable, such as furthering the interest of particular individuals or groups, or perpetuating an unjust, yet deeply entrenched, social structure, O'Hear's defense of traditionalism would seem to be sorely lacking. This lack is, in my mind, the main weakness of The Landscape of Humanity. I suspect that the average educated reader, to whom this work is supposedly addressed, would think that general critiques of the various traditions integral to O'Hear's vision -- critiques in wide circulation among the general reading public -- have not been responded to at all.

Articulating a traditionalist humanist vision in our times is, in my view, a valuable project, but anyone undertaking such a task must engage with the critiques of traditionalism from those whose disenfranchisement and subordination has been partly justified by appeal to those traditions. Just as O'Hear may feel that some throw the baby out with the bathwater when they spurn traditions, so he, at times, appears to hold on to the water no matter how dirty it may be. A real reevaluation of traditions is needed, by someone who understands the value of traditions, yet is sensitive to the harms they can perpetuate.

In The Landscape of Humanity, O'Hear is at his best as critic. His examination of individual artworks is perceptive and his analysis of Popper's "open society" will surely be met with interest by Popper fans. I was particularly appreciative of his criticism of a currently prevailing way of approaching and presenting classical works to modern readers and audiences in "To Swim with Strong Strokes in the Lake of Antique Poetry". This is the approach to classical works, such as the Iliad or Oresteia, which aims to make the subject matter understandable and relevant to modern audiences by adapting the ancient characters and their concerns to their closest contemporary relatives. In this spirit the gods become a group of powerful, but petty gangsters, Patroclus a younger nephew to Achilles instead of his beloved, and Athena, the goddess of war, a spoiled adolescent girl. And why? Because the modern audience wouldn't find intelligible the idea that there were many gods who not only interacted with each other and the humans, but who also interfered with the course of events? Because love between men is unfathomable? Because the exercise of power and acts of revenge by female characters, however divine, is unintelligible? Or is it that to draw audiences (and pay for a very expensive film production) we had better make sure that the subject matter is close enough to the audience's own navel? O'Hear urges us to let these classic works speak for themselves, in all their cultural and temporal alterity.

In sum, in The Landscape of Humanity O'Hear offers reflections on various topics of interest to the general reader, but his articulation of humane traditionalism lacks any real engagement with actual or potential critics of traditions and traditionalism.