The Legalization of Drugs: For & Against

Placeholder book cover

Douglas Husak and Peter de Marneffe, The Legalization of Drugs: For & Against, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 204pp., $18.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521546869.

Reviewed by William Hawk, James Madison University


In the United States the production, distribution and use of marijuana, heroin, and cocaine are crimes subjecting the offender to imprisonment. The Legalization of Drugs, appearing in the series "For and Against" edited by R. G. Frey for Cambridge University Press, raises the seldom-asked philosophical question of the justification, if any, of imprisoning persons for drug offenses.

Douglas Husak questions the justification for punishing persons who use drugs such as marijuana, heroin, and cocaine. He develops a convincing argument that imprisonment is never morally justified for drug use. Put simply, incarceration is such a harsh penalty that drug use, generally harmless to others and less harmful to the user than commonly supposed, fails to justify it. Any legal scheme that punishes drug users to achieve another worthy goal, such as creating a disincentive to future drug users, violates principles of justice.

Peter de Marneffe contends that under some circumstances society is morally justified in punishing persons who produce and distribute heroin. He argues a theoretical point that anticipated rises in drug abuse and consequent effects on young people may justify keeping heroin production and distribution illegal. According to de Marneffe's analysis, however, harsh prison penalties currently imposed on drug offenders are unjustified.

The points of discord between Husak's and de Marneffe's positions are serious but not as telling as is their implicit agreement. Current legal practices and policies which lead to lengthy incarceration of those who produce, distribute and use drugs such as marijuana, heroin, and cocaine are not, and cannot be, morally justified. Both arguments, against imprisoning drug users and for keeping heroin production illegal, merit a broad and careful reading.

The United States has erected an enormous legal structure involving prosecution and incarceration designed to prohibit a highly pleasurable, sometimes medically indicated and personally satisfying activity, namely using marijuana, heroin, and cocaine. At the same time, other pleasure-producing drugs, such as tobacco, alcohol, and caffeine, though legally regulated for the purposes of consumer safety and under-age consumption, can be purchased over the counter. As a result, while the health and safety risks of cigarettes may be greater than those proven to accompany marijuana, one can buy cigarettes from a vending machine and but go to prison for smoking marijuana. A rational legal system, according to Husak, demands a convincing, but as yet not forthcoming, explanation of why one pleasurable drug subjects users to the risk of imprisonment while the other is accommodated in restaurants.

Drug prohibitionists must face the problem that any "health risk" argument used to distinguish illicit drugs and subject offenders to prison sentences runs up against the known, yet tolerated, health risks of tobacco, as well as the additional health risks associated with incarceration. "Social costs" arguments targeting heroin or cocaine runs up against the known, yet tolerated, social costs of alcohol, as well as the additional social costs of incarceration. Even if one were to accept that illicit drugs were more harmful or exacted greater social costs than tobacco and alcohol (and the empirical studies referred to in the text do not generally support this thesis), that difference proves insufficient to justify imprisoning producers, distributors or especially users of illicit drugs.

Decriminalizing Drug Use. Douglas Husak presents a very carefully argued case for decriminalizing drug use. He begins his philosophical argument by clarifying the concepts and issues involved. To advocate the legalization of drugs calls for a legal system in which the production and sale of drugs are not criminal offenses. (p. 3) Criminalization of drugs makes the use of certain drugs a criminal offense, i.e. one deserving punishment. To argue for drug decriminalization, as Husak does, is not necessarily to argue for legalization of drugs. Husak entertains, but cautiously rejects the notion of a system where production and sale of drugs is illegal while use is not a crime. De Marneffe advocates such a system.

Punishing persons by incarceration demands justification. Since the state's use of punishment is a severe tool and incarceration is by its nature "degrading, demoralizing and dangerous" (p. 29) we must be able to provide "a compelling reason … to justify the infliction of punishment… ." (p. 34) Husak finds no compelling reason for imprisoning drug users. After considering four standard justifications for punishing drug users Husak concludes that "the arguments for criminalization are not sufficiently persuasive to justify the infliction of punishment."

Reasons to Criminalize Drug Use. 1) Drug users, it is claimed, should be punished in order to protect the health and well being of citizens. No doubt states are justified in protecting the health and well being of citizens. But does putting drug users in prison contribute to this worthy goal? Certainly not for those imprisoned. For those who might be deterred from using drugs the question is whether the drugs from which they are deterred by the threat of imprisonment actually pose a health risk. For one, Husak quotes research showing that currently illicit drugs do not obviously pose a greater health threat than alcohol or tobacco. For another, he quotes a statistic showing that approximately four times as many persons die annually from using prescribed medicines than die from using illegal drugs. In addition, one-fourth of all pack-a-day smokers lose ten to fifteen years of their lives but no one would entertain the idea of incarcerating smokers to further their health interests or in order to prevent non-smokers from beginning. In sum, Husak accepts that drug use poses health risks but contends that the risks are not greater than others that are socially accepted. Even if they were greater, imprisonment does not reduce, but compounds the health risks for prisoners.

2) Punishing drug users protects children. Husak here responds to de Marneffe's essay which focuses on potential drug abuse and promotes the welfare of children as a justification for keeping drug production and sale illegal. Husak finds punishing adolescent users a peculiar way to protect them. To punish one drug-using adolescent in order to prevent a non-using adolescent from using drugs is ineffective and also violates justice. Punishing adult users so that youth do not begin using drugs and do not suffer from neglect -- which is de Marneffe's position -- is not likely to prevent adolescents from becoming drug users, and even if it did, one would have to show that the harm prevented to the youth justifies imprisoning adults. Husak contends that punishing adults or youth, far from protecting youth, puts them at greater risk.

3) Some, e.g. former New York City mayor Guiliani, argue that punishing drug use prevents crime. Husak, conceding a connection between drug use and crime, turns the argument upside-down, showing how punishment increases rather than decreases crime. For one, criminalization of drugs forces the drug industry to settle disputes extra-legally. Secondly, drug decriminalization would likely lower drug costs thereby reducing economic crimes. Thirdly, to those who contend that illicit drugs may increase violence and aggression Husak responds that: a) empirical evidence does not support marijuana or heroin as causes of violence and b) empirical evidence does support alcohol, which is decriminalized, as leading to violence. Husak concludes "if we propose to ban those drugs that are implicated in criminal behavior, no drug would be a better candidate for criminalization than alcohol." (p. 70) Finally, punishing drug users likely increases crime rates since those imprisoned for drug use are released with greater tendencies and skills for future criminal activity.

4) Drug use ought to be punished because using drugs is immoral. In addition to standard philosophical objections to legal moralism, Husak contends that there is no good reason to think that recreational drug use is immoral. Drug use violates no rights. Other recreationally used drugs such as alcohol, tobacco or caffeine are not immoral. The only accounts according to which drug use is immoral are religiously based and generally not shared in the citizenry. Husak argues that legal moralism fails, and with it the attempts to justify imprisoning drug users because of health and well-being, protecting children, or reducing crime. Husak concludes, "If I am correct, prohibitionists are more clearly guilty of immorality than their opponents. The wrongfulness of recreational drug use, if it exists at all, pales against the immorality of punishing drug users." (p. 82)

Reasons to Decriminalize Drug Use. Husak's positive case for decriminalizing drug use begins with acknowledgement that drug use is or may be highly pleasurable. In addition, some drugs aid relaxation, others increase energy and some promote spiritual enlightenment or literary and artistic creativity. The simple fun and euphoria attendant to drug use should count for permitting it.

The fact that criminalization of drug use proves to be counter-productive provides Husak a set of final substantial reasons for decriminalizing use. Criminalizing drugs proves counter-productive along several different lines: 1) criminalization is aimed and selectively enforced against minorities, 2) public health risks increase because drugs are dealt on the street, 3) foreign policy is negatively affected by corrupt governments being supported solely because they support anti-drug policies, 4) a frank and open discussion about drug policy is impossible in the United States, 5) civil liberties are eroded by drug enforcement, 6) some government corruption stems from drug payoffs and 7) criminalization costs tens of billions of dollars per year.

Douglas Husak provides the conceptual clarity needed to work one's way through the various debates surrounding drug use and the law. He establishes a high threshold that must be met in order to justify the state's incarcerating someone. Having laid this groundwork Husak demonstrates that purported justifications for drug criminalization fail and that good reasons for decriminalizing drug use prevail. For persons who worry about what drug decriminalization means for children, Husak counsels that there is more to fear from prosecution and conviction of youth for using drugs than there is to fear from the drugs themselves.

Against Legalizing Drug Production and Distribution. Peter de Marneffe offers an argument against drug legalization. The argument itself is simple. If drugs are legalized, there will be more drug abuse. If there is more drug abuse that is bad. Drug abuse is sufficiently bad to justify making drug production and distribution illegal. Therefore, drugs should not be legalized. The weight of this argument is carried by the claim that the badness of drug abuse is sufficient to justify making drug production and sale illegal.

De Marneffe centers his argument on heroin. Heroin, he contends, is highly pleasurable but sharply depresses motivation to achieve worthwhile goals and meet responsibilities. Accordingly, children in an environment where heroin is legal will be subjected to neglect by heroin using parents and, if they themselves use heroin, they will be harmed by diminished motivation for achievement for the remainder of their lives. It is this later harm to the ambition and motivation of young people that, according to de Marneffe, justifies criminalizing heroin production and sale. As he puts it:

… the risk of lost opportunities that some individuals would bear as the result of heroin legalization justifies the risks of criminal liability and other burdens that heroin prohibition imposes on other individuals. The legalization of heroin would create a social environment -- call it the legalization environment -- in which some children would be at a substantially higher risk of irresponsible heroin abuse by their parents and in which some adolescents would be at a substantially higher risk of self-destructive heroin abuse. (p. 124)

Are the liberties of individual adult drug producers, distributors and users sacrificed? Yes, but this may be justified by de Marneffe's "burdens principle." According to the burdens principle, "the government violates a person's moral rights in adopting a policy that limits her liberty if and only if in adopting this policy the government imposes a burden on her that is substantially worse than the worst burden anyone would bear in the absence of this policy." (p. 159) According to this, de Marneffe claims that burdens on drug vendors or users may be justified by the prevention of harms to a particular individual or individuals. As he puts it:

What I claim in favor of heroin prohibition is that the reasons of at least one person to prefer her situation in a prohibition environment outweigh everyone else's reasons to prefer his or her situation in a legalization environment, assuming that the penalties are gradual and proportionate and other relevant conditions are met. (p. 161)

According to this view, the objective interest of a single adolescent in not losing ambition, motivation and drive justifies the imposition of burdens on other youth and adults who would prefer using drugs. Although Johnny might choose heroin use, his objective interest is for future motivation and ambition that is not harmed by heroin use.

De Marneffe's "burdens principle" seems to hold the whole society hostage to the objective liberty interests of one individual. Were this principle applied to drug producers or distributors who faced imprisonment it seems that imprisonment could not be justified. I suspect a concern for consistency here gives de Marneffe reason to make drug production and distribution illegal but without attaching harsh prison sentences for offenders. He advocates an environment where drugs are not legal, in order to protect youth against both abuse and their own choices that may cause them to become unmotivated, but recognizes that prison sentences are unjustified as a way to support such a system.

In The Legalization of Drugs the reader gets two interesting arguments. Douglas Husak makes a compelling case against punishing drug users. His position amounts to drug decriminalization with skepticism toward making drug production and sale illegal. On the other side, Peter de Marneffe justifies making drug production and sale illegal based upon the diminishment of future interests of young people. De Marneffe introduces a "burdens principle" which is likely much too strong a commitment to individual interests than could ever be realized in a civil society. In both instances, the reader is treated to arguments that effectively undermine current drug policy. The book provides philosophical argumentation that should stimulate a societal conversation about the justifiability of current drug laws.