The Legend of the Middle Ages: Philosophical Explorations of Medieval Christianity, Judaism, and Islam

Placeholder book cover

Rémi Brague, The Legend of the Middle Ages: Philosophical Explorations of Medieval Christianity, Judaism, and Islam, Lydia Cochrane (trans.), University of Chicago Press, 2009, 287pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226070803.

Reviewed by David Burrell, C.S.C., University of Notre Dame/Uganda Martyrs University


In a translation from the original French that captures its verve, readers are invited to join Rémi Brague's tour d'horizon of the philosophical interspace available to us once we attend to the works of medieval Jews, Christians, and Muslims, as they utilized their respective revelations to probe the reality of the universe. These groups were seldom in contact with one another, though some later inquirers (Maimonides) did profit from earlier ones (Ghazali), as Aquinas did from "Rabbi Moses." Hence Brague rightly insists that the rich mutuality that we are able to discern was seldom available to them. Yet he invites us to share in, as well as develop for ourselves, that quality of sensitivity which animates this comparative work, greatly facilitated by retaining the informal style of the original lectures. We need that assistance, since his erudition can be daunting, yet this account will illuminate novices as well as adepts embarked on a shared journey into a fascinating world. While we increasingly share the journey, Brague forcibly reminds us that what we desire to transmute into dialogue was largely, for the writers he discusses, polemics (199-202). By using contemporary reflections on hermeneutics and other sophisticated tools we enjoy today, he deftly introduces us into this world in a way that helps us attain the consciousness demanded to understand "the other," so as better to appreciate our own limitations. In fact, that correlative activity of coming to understand ourselves as we seek to understand the other fairly defines the journey on which these essays launch us. So it could best be described as an exercise in self-understating, facilitated by a rich store of historical examples, deftly employed.

That self-understating is initially directed to philosophy itself, as submitting to the tutelage of its medieval practitioners can show us how limited -- even myopic -- our grasp of that subject can be. The lecture style is enhanced by an initial interview, which directs Braque's erudition to our service by reminding us how he was invited by circumstance to fill a notorious lacuna of eight hundred years in French university philosophical curriculum, with the result that: "in the domain of medieval philosophical studies, I was thus, and basically I have remained, a newcomer, a beginner, an outsider" (8, 25). This confession allows us to accept the fact that we are nearly all novices in this inquiry, and so welcome newcomers in a shared journey of discovery -- and self-discovery. (I have always been grateful that Fritz Zimmerman did just that for me a quarter of a century ago, as I passed though Oxford with an inchoate project of comparative study.) So the signal merit of these reflections is to let oneself be mentored in a gently demanding way.

Take, for example, the asymmetries in the endeavor of translating, for "all societies are defined by a unique style of negotiating their relations with others" (163). Hence the west learned from the Greeks through the Arabs, who can be regarded as "the only legitimate heirs of the ancient Greeks" (166).  However, although "the Islamic world translated a good deal to the point that the Arabs can perhaps be called the inventors of translation, [nevertheless] the Muslims did not learn Greek" (168). All of this nuanced discussion will also bolster Brague's celebrated thesis about the heteronymous origins of Europe: whatever is of worth came from elsewhere -- Christianity emerging out of Judaism, philosophy from Islamic sources, and so on. Brague is especially illuminating, as I just suggested, in noting the asymmetric and often tentative character of these exchanges. Addressing the question of what sorts of inquiry deserve the name 'philosophy', he points out that the episteme which goes by that name has undergone manifold shifts, citing Pierre Hadot's staunch reminder of the role which "spiritual exercises" always played in Hellenic philosophy. I would add: in Islamic philosophy as well, once we trace it beyond the axial figure of Averroës, returning with it to the Arab and Persian heartland, in Suhrwaradi, Ibn al-Arabi, and Mulla Sadra. On this point, Brague is ambiguous if not curiously silent, referring principally to Henri Corbin's theses. But after Corbin's trail-blazing endeavors, others have called attention to the enrichment 'philosophy' enjoyed from that move, without diverting our attention by introducing terms like 'theosophy'. (I am thinking especially of John Walbridge and Hossein Ziai on Suhrawardi, or William Chittick and Salman Bashier on Ibn al-Arabi; James Morris, Sajjad Rizvl, and Cecilia Bonmariage on Mulla Sadra.) I see this return of Islamic philosophy to the heartland, and especially to Persia and Shi'ite culture, as a transformation "of the episteme" into a more explicitly philosophical theology. Thus I would temper the strict bifurcations which Brague appears to endorse here, yet which his own work usually breaches even while French academic life strictly observes them. Indeed, by citing Pierre Hadot, Rémi Brague prepares the way for such an enriched understanding of philosophical inquiry itself.

At the same time, his summary assessment of the closet argument regarding how to name this domain -- 'Arabic philosophy' or 'Islamic philosophy' -- seems sane: "it is thus acceptable to speak of an 'Islamic philosophy', on the condition that we understand 'Islamic' to refer to a civilization and not a religion" (70). Indeed, one is constantly returned to Marshall Hodgson's richly evocative neologism, "the Islamicate". Moreover, if we consider studies of Ibn Sina's use of allegory (by Peter Heath) as well as the very recent comparative study of Ibn Rushd [Averroës] and al-Ghazali by Avital Wohlman[1], they all point to a richer vein of philosophical inquiry endemic to Islamic philosophy -- indeed, one with which I suspect Rémi Brague would be quite consonant, for it is carried out with meticulous rigor (as by Mulla Sadra) yet always presumes that something more than logical acumen will be needed for an adequate understanding of the arguments employed. With Pierre Hadot, Mulla Sadra identifies this 'more' with "spiritual exercises". Does that move us beyond 'philosophy' or more deeply into it? However one proceeds to address that question, we have established one point clearly: 'philosophy' will always reflect the culture of which it is a part and which it seeks to address. Consider the pregnant moves, closer to home, from 'modernity' to 'post-modernity', and the multiple paths those moves exhibit. I would suggest that his dual proposal for cultural appropriation -- 'inclusion' and 'digestion' -- might be illuminated by a strategy proposed by Robert Sokolowski, who observes how we 'recapitulate' others in an effort to find our own way, much as Aquinas 'recapitulated' Aristotle in shaping his own metaphysics. Yet again, these metaphors are useful ways of articulating one's own efforts, but remain empty until we try it ourselves. In fact, the directions Brague offers are inherently perfomative, giving the text its mentoring mien.

Indeed, the signal fruit of journeying with Rémi Brague on these constructive and deconstructive forays is to appreciate the quality of awareness required to find one's way around the rich panoply of 'Islamic philosophy' as it proceeds by translation and then by permutation into new forms. Throughout, the journey is as anthropological as it is strictly philosophical, and that too suggests what we can learn about 'philosophy' by allowing ourselves to be guided by so adept "a beginner". I have suggested some of the sinuous turns the journey takes; others are best left to readers to discover, as the text hardly lends itself to the sort of canvassing of' 'positions' for which reviewers normally settle.

[1] Contrepoint entre le sens commun et la philosophy en Islam: Ghazali et Averroès [Paris: Editions du Cerf, 2008], translated as Al-Ghazali, Averroes and the Interpretation of the Qur'an: Common Sense and Philosophy in Islam [London: Routledge, 2009].