The Leibniz-De Volder Correspondence: With Selections from the Correspondence Between Leibniz and Johann Bernoulli

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G.W. Leibniz, The Leibniz-De Volder CorrespondenceWith Selections from the Correspondence Between Leibniz and Johann Bernoulli, Paul Lodge (ed., tr.), Yale University Press, 2013, ci + 415 pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780300108231

Reviewed by Wiep van Bunge, Erasmus Universiteit Rotterdam


Reconstructing the philosophical development of Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz is a notoriously difficult enterprise. Over the past few years alone, such experts as Catherine Wilson, Christia Mercer and Daniel Garber have come to widely varying conclusions, and it was only in 2009 that Rosa Maria Antognazza succeeded in providing a comprehensive intellectual bibliography of the man. It is not difficult to see why this should be, for Leibniz's scholarly output remains astounding: he contributed not only to all the philosophical disciplines of his day, but also, famously, to mathematics, physics, geology, biology, medicine and psychology, as well as to theology, jurisprudence, linguistics and history. In addition, he played a crucial role in the early histories of calculation machines and European sinology. The Leibniz Nachlass is reported to consist of nearly 200,000 pages, including 15,000 letters exchanged with some 1,100 correspondents.

More often than not, Leibniz's correspondents were also at a loss about how to keep track of his creative genius, not least because of his curious publication policies. A regular contributor to such journals as the Journal des Sçavans, the Acta Eruditorum and the Histoire des ouvrages des savants, many of his ideas yet remained hidden in his massive private correspondence. Nearly all of his major texts were published posthumously, including his Nouveaux Essais, which only saw the light of day in 1765. Clearly, the editing of Leibniz's papers presents a daunting scholarly challenge, which in 1985 was taken up by the Leibniz Archive in Hanover in cooperation with editorial centres in Münster, Potsdam and Berlin. It is supervised by the Göttingen and the Berlin-Brandenburg Academies of Sciences, and to date, the Leibniz Archive has managed to add 33 volumes to the mere 19 published from 1901 to 1985. In due course, the Akademie Ausgabe will come to replace the nineteenth-century edition of C.I. Gerhardt.

The Leibniz Nachlass will be published in eight separate series, three of which will contain his correspondence. At present, the philosophical correspondence from 1695 to 1700 is being prepared by Martin Schneider and Stephan Meier-Oeser. It will be presented as Volume II, iii of the Akademie edition, but a Vorausedition is available online already. So Paul Lodge's edition of Leibniz's correspondence with Burchard de Volder is more than welcome, as is his translation into English (Leibniz and de Volder corresponded, of course, in Latin). Lodge was in a unique position to prepare this edition, having edited Leibniz and his Correspondents (2004) and having studied the correspondence between Leibniz and De Volder "for more years than I care to remember" (p. xi). In particular the detailed annotation, as well as the highly perceptive Introduction accompanying the 67 letters, turns this fourth installment of The Yale Leibniz Series into something of a gem. It should be added that over half of the letters collected in this volume were written by or addressed to Johann Bernoulli, who acted as a mediator between Leibniz and De Volder. Unfortunately, most of the letters exchanged between Bernoulli and de Volder are lost, and understandably only a small selection of the huge correspondence between Leibniz and Bernoulli is presented here. As far as the correspondence between Leibniz and De Volder is concerned, all the material of philosophical relevance has been included.

Parts of Leibniz's letters to De Volder have been translated into English before, but this is the first translation ever of De Volder's letters. This should come as no surprise, for few experts of early modern philosophy have ever read a single line written by this Leiden professor, despite the fact that he was widely considered one of the leading authorities on natural philosophy during his lifetime. Being a professor, he was not really expected to publish much besides the occasional oratio and the habitual series of disputationes. Born and raised in Amsterdam in a Mennonite family, he took his doctorate in medicine in 1664 at Leiden University. Six years later Leiden gave him a chair in philosophy, and in 1682 added a chair in mathematics. Trained as a Cartesian, he continued to uphold Descartes's natural philosophy until well into the 1690s. Jean Le Clerc's Éloge de feu, however, written in 1709 shortly after De Volder's death, had it that by the end of his life De Volder had abandoned Cartesianism in favour of the experimental approach flourishing across the Channel. A s early as 1675, following a visit to the Royal Society, De Volder had managed to install a physics laboratory at the university in order to illustrate his lectures experimentally.

To Leibniz, De Volder must have been an extremely interesting correspondent. Holding a crucial position at one of the finest universities in Europe, this possibly wavering adherent to Cartesianism would have made a wonderful ally at a time of great confusion in natural philosophy. Half a century earlier, Descartes had managed to make many friends both at Utrecht and Leiden, and this had turned the academic infrastructure of the Dutch Republic into a major asset in the further proliferation of "Cartesianism". So, in what looks like an attempt to emulate Descartes's example, Leibniz first addressed De Volder by the very end of 1698, when Descartes's philosophy was rapidly losing much of its former credibility. In 1687, Isaac Newton had sent De Volder a presentation copy of the Principia mathematica, but De Volder, who was purported to be one of the few scholars on the Continent able to grasp the mathematics involved, remained unconvinced. As is well-known, it was only following the publication of the second edition of the Principia in 1713 that "Newtonianism" would start to conquer Europe, and in doing so it would redefine the relationship between natural philosophy and metaphysics for most of the eighteenth century. Leibniz for his part had been working on his own alternative to Cartesianism, and in the course of his correspondence with De Volder, he gradually proposed his own views on substance, after having criticized Descartes's conception of matter as extended substance.

Despite his willingness to defend Cartesianism (e.g.,, against Huet's Censura of 1694) over the years De Volder appears to have grown increasingly sceptical of Descartes's ability to explain "the cause of motion in bodies". The correspondence with Leibniz testified to his willingness to at least consider alternative approaches to the concept of substance, involving some notion of activity. Typically, however, De Volder kept insisting on an a priori demonstration of the active nature of corporeal substance, which Leibniz refused to deliver. In view of Le Clerc's statement about De Volder's mature abandonment of Cartesianism, De Volder remained remarkably loyal to Descartes's methodology as well as to his definition of extended substance. Le Clerc, it should be added, was one of the first Continental scholars embracing Locke's "way of ideas" as well as Newton's Principia. As a consequence, we are left wondering whether De Volder's "disenchantment" with Cartesianism should not, perhaps, be interpreted as the product of the ambiguous heritage of Descartes himself, for the relationship between the rather sketchy metaphysics that Descartes concocted as a young man and his more mature work in the natural sciences is often rather loose. This much is clear, however: at no stage of the correspondence, which was terminated by De Volder in 1706, was the Leiden academic willing to accept Leibniz's dismissal of the reality of a corporeal substance.

As noted above, the origins of Leibniz's mature views on substance have elicited widely varying interpretations. This edition will not settle the debate, but in his long Introduction Lodge makes a valiant effort to spell out the significance of this correspondence, in which he discerns five distinctive phases. The first, consisting of the exchange between Leibniz and Bernoulli during the summer and autumn of 1698, anticipates many of the topics subsequently discussed between Leibniz and De Volder. In fact, Leibniz initiates the enquiry into the Cartesian definition of matter by pointing to its inability to account for the elasticity of material objects. In the next phase, Leibniz and De Volder discuss the measure of motive force, and after a prolonged and sometimes confusing exchange, De Volder appears to be willing to accept Leibniz's laws for measuring force. By the spring of 1700 the debate moved from Leibniz's dynamics to issues of metaphysics and epistemology. According to Lodge, this more technical episode of the correspondence mainly served Leibniz as a test: was De Volder up to his standards? Apparently the Leiden professor passed the test, but during the third phase, it looks as if the tables are turned: taking Leibniz up on his repeated claim that Descartes' notion of substance fails to accommodate its intrinsic activity, De Volder keeps asking in vain for an a priori demonstration by Leibniz that every substance is active. Leibniz was unable to supply such a demonstration, but instead went on to criticize De Volder's Cartesian concept of substance, after which Leibniz's own metaphysics takes centre stage. It has always been this particular moment that has drawn the attention of Leibniz scholars bent on tracing the emergence of his mature metaphysics, for La Monadologie would of course only appear in 1714, two years before the German philosopher passed away.

Leibniz, however, failed to win De Volder over to his position. During the fifth and final stage of their encounter, De Volder grew increasingly impatient with Leibniz's ontology, which allowed only for the existence of mindlike "monads". In January 1706, he terminated the correspondence.

In view of the many, mutual misunderstandings (e.g., on the nature of extension and the "entelechies" Leibniz introduced), beautifully elucidated by Lodge, it is indeed remarkable that De Volder did not do so much earlier. In a sense, this correspondence reads like the history of a massive failure, but this hardly diminishes its relevance, providing as it does a highly instructive insight into a fascinating episode from the heyday of Continental rationalism. Paul Lodge proves to be its ideal editor and translator.