The Life of Understanding: A Contemporary Hermeneutics

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James Risser, The Life of Understanding: A Contemporary Hermeneutics, Indiana University Press, 2012, 154pp., $32.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253002143.

Reviewed by Timothy A.D. Hyde, Stony Brook University


Risser's book is a collection of seven articles, four previously published. Each article comes up with new ways to express Heideggerian and Gadamerian insights but it is far from a rehash of old ground. The book makes new forays into die Sache selbst; often has implicit reservations about Gadamer's emphasis, at the very least; addresses many recurrent philosophical chestnuts; and richly juxtaposes Gadamer to Nietzsche, Vattimo, Schleiermacher, Derrida, Agamben, Aristotle, Augustine, Aquinas, Stoicism, Jabès, Rilke, and Hegel among, in passing, many others. The brevity of the book as a whole and the shortness of each piece (the first three are twenty pages each, the next four only ten) and the fact that they are only loosely connected is one of its great strengths. All things being equal, short books are better than long ones, as such eminent yet diverse thinkers as David Hume and William James each discovered the hard way. Each piece is a real hermeneutic treat with rich, suggestive, and non-reductive analyses that in their content and methodology resist the simple summary that is of necessity, unfortunately, called for in a review. The best that I can do here is to showcase some of the issues raised and paths taken.

The first three essays are loosely centered on issues of tradition and its transmission. The first evokes the idea of convalescence that is no mere overcoming of sickness; the second wandering and return that places the foreign at the heart of the home; the third Bildung, in which what is recovered is a promissory note to the future. The last four essays center on language. The fourth is about the kind of non-totalizing weaving that hermeneutics involves and that always leaves more to be said. The fifth considers an incapacity in language that is the condition of possibility that allows for the Sache selbst to come to language. The sixth considers a certain silence in the voice of the written word. The seventh uses an analysis of beauty to think through the originary vitality of language.

The first essay is centered around the idea of a hermeneutic of convalescence. Risser nicely brings out two aspects of convalescence. First, that the idea of health it invokes is not one based on the technê of medicine, with all the objectification that involves, but on self-sustaining due measure -- which harks back to Plato's use of metrion as opposed to metron in the Statesmen. Second, by tracing variegated themes of convalescence in Nietzsche, Heidegger and Gadamer, Risser argues that convalescence is not simply a question of negating sickness in order to return to health but rather of living a life in both sickness and health, a kind of saving and preserving that lets what conceals itself be revealed but without taking its self-concealment away from it. Risser then raises three pertinent issues. First, he asks what the character of convalescing is, but what he really addresses is a common criticism of Nietzsche, Heidegger, and Gadamer, namely, that they are merely nostalgic for some perfect past to which they wish to return. Risser argues that the kind of living involved in convalescence, as he envisages it, is neither based on a history-denying faith in progress or some complete recovery, but neither does it, nor do its proponents counsel, some transmission of past history that could remain self-same. Convalescence is neither a critical overcoming nor a simple acceptance. What is overcome is rather overcoming itself (18). This entails a new understanding of our relation to our tradition: "Überlieferung as transmission is . . . a liberating by way of tradition, but not a liberating from tradition" (20). Naturally, if the recovery involved in this hermeneutic convalescence isn't some return to the absence of sickness, that raises the question, "What is it?" This is Risser's second issue. Here he makes use of the idea of "constant attention that will take hold of life in its transformation" (24) as well as of the idea of a practical anamnesis, a struggling with the waters of Lethe he finds in the Myth of Er at the end of the Republic and the very Heideggerian idea of tarrying with questioning. Given that a full healthy recovery is not the goal of this convalescence, Risser needs to and does address what this convalescence is supposed to accomplish. Namely, he envisages it as a kind of saving, lasting, preserving that is a repetitive retracing of division, but one in the mode of care, not Heideggerian care, but the care for one's interlocutor that Socrates seems to exemplify in his practice of dialectical psuchagogia. The sort of care that allows for anamnesis, but of course does not "teach" anything. This is the sort of care that only wishes to turn the eyes of the soul towards the light, not give it sight.

The second essay is divided into four parts. It begins with a meditation on theoria as a departure into the foreign to witness a spectacle and a return home to give a verbal report, and it fittingly finishes with a meditation on the reporting of the hermeneut. In the middle sections, Risser effects a rapprochement between Heidegger and Gadamer. Although he admits that Gadamer does not find language as irredeemably infected with metaphysics as Heidegger does, Risser argues that there is no simple and easy return home for Gadamer (35). As Risser puts it in the second part, the poetic changes both language and the poet, just as the voyage into the strange changes the voyager and the place returned to too. In the third part, Risser concedes that Heidegger's concern for the truth leads him to emphasize wandering and errancy as opposed to being uprooted. But Gadamer still appreciates that "the operation of hermeneutics actually carries out double movement: there is the act of return in which the alienating distanciation is overcome, but such overcoming remains infiltrated by a strangeness" (38-39).

The third essay is about Bildung and Gadamer's appropriation of the concept. Hermeneutic Bildung is an interpretive enactment of life, an "opening of a shared life in which one is able to hear the voice of the other" (53), one which "pertains fundamentally to the community of logos that unites [but does not assimilate] one to another in its enactment" (55). The essay has five parts to it. The first four are mainly about various interpretations of Bildung in terms of self-creation, paideia, sensus communis in the early modern period, good judgment, and aesthetic judgment in Kant. Most of the heavy lifting occurs in the fifth and final part. Risser wishes to flesh out this Bildung in terms of memory, which in turn he connects with a Gadamerian sense of promising -- in partial opposition to a Derridian sense of promising -- particularly in the sense of reconciliation in which "the otherness that can not be sublated [is] raised up into the actuality of living and thinking in community and solidarity" -- opposed to an Hegelian version of forgiveness. The sense of memory Risser has in mind is obviously not the sense of a forgotten fact remembered, but rather, holding in mind the absent that is shot through with loss. Not only that, but what is recovered wasn't ever simply present in the first place -- and here the reference to Plato's anamnesis is apropos. Finally, even when what is recovered is held in mind, it is always a promissory note to a "possible future" (57), a future that we cannot dictate and that may betray us (58).

The fourth essay is centered around two themes, weaving and arithmos. The topic is really a meditation on the inadequacy of a part-whole schema for hermeneutics. Both themes are supposed to model a separating and combining that approximates dialectic (62). Weaving is supposed to capture the force of intelligibility: a wanting to say (71) that drives conversation. Arithmos is supposed to capture how the framework for interpretation is generated by the identity and difference of a divided logos (69). The question lurking behind the meditations is the difference between Gadamer and Schleiermacher, on the one hand, and Hegel, on the other. Risser, although deferential, seems to have an implicit criticism of Gadamer, namely, that his return to a "Schleiermacheran idea of a structural relation between whole and part" (63) is at the very least misleading because he wants, or should want, to keep hermeneutics in relation to a fore-understanding in such a way that there is never an actual whole of tradition or meaning. The difference between Gadamer and Hegel is cashed out in the ideas of phronesis and due measure (metrion) of the Statesman. For Gadamer -- and for Plato -- there is a "concretion of meaning relative to the appropriateness to the subject matter" (64) as opposed to Hegel, whose concretization always requires formal mediation.

The fifth essay considers an incapacity at the heart of language. There are three aspects to this incapacity. First, Risser considers the motility of the life of language. Here he quotes Gadamer. To find the word that reaches the other "the finite possibilities of the word are orientated towards the sense intended as towards the infinite" (73). Second, this motility requires a structural incapacity. Here Risser uses Agamben's analysis of an inherent Aristotelian potentiality to not-be, although the distinction between possibly not saying is muddled with an incapacity to say. Third, Risser draws out this incapacity's ground in radically finite hermeneutics in contrast to Plato, Heidegger and Hegel. Yet, again there seems to be an implicit criticism of Gadamer. Risser argues that much of Gadamer's emphasis is on the incompleteness of language rather than incapacity; that there is always more left to be said, that there are limits to language such as the pre-linguistic and extra-linguistic like laughter (74-5), rather than a more radical finitude, something that cannot be said, an impossibility that is at work in language. Risser argues that if we do not, as perhaps Gadamer did not, fully plumb the depths of the incapacity of language, we risk reducing what is not said to a mere question of time, the not said yet, which, as Risser rightly remarks, returns us to essentialism (85).

The sixth essay asks how the voice of the written is to be understood and ponders the relation between the spoken and written word. The first of three parts discusses the voice of the word in the Phaedrus. The second considers Gadamer's position and the third is Risser's own extension of the analysis. Risser reads the primacy of the word of the soul in the Phaedrus as a metaphor (89) explaining what a Platonic dialogue is supposed to accomplish and avoid, namely avoid ossification and accomplish "the generation of words with respect to the living movement of thought . . . the movement that Plato calls dialectic" (89). Thus Risser moves Plato's priority of the spoken word closer to a metaphor for the priority of the voice within text and hence Gadamer's position, which finally implies an inner hearing of an "appearing word" that is "neither sensible nor intelligible" but "illuminating" (96) and appears in the beautiful that "is an encounter with a word oriented toward a unity of meaning . . . that generates meaning in its self-presentation" (96-7). Risser, moving beyond Gadamer, wonders about another kind of beautiful discourse, which at its heart has a silence that, paradoxically, speaks. Whereas Gadamer says that "we read what was never written," Risser wants to go further, quoting Jabès, "we read what can never be written" (98). This sibling discourse, however, as Risser admits, doesn't seem to fall under the beautiful with its emphasis on harmony and unity. The beauty in this sibling discourse would have to be the "appearance of a self-interrupting whole" that releases the reader to the "vitality of discourse" that connects back to the Phaedrus where the beautiful is "a provocation for the vitality of discourse" (98).

The seventh essay works out the vitality of language, "the generation of words in relation to the living movement of thought" (99), in terms of the strange flash of beauty. Working off Plato, Risser teases out three aspects to the beautiful. It shines forth with the same kind of self-evidence as truth; it captivates in a way that liberates one for the view upon being; and it is entangled with the very order of being in its due measure (102). Moreover, as against, say, the good, beauty as idea is manifest in the visible. Risser moves on to work out the hermeneutics of the beautiful along these lines, namely, in terms of unconcealment, self-authentication and the unity of meaning. Here Risser has implicit criticisms of both Heidegger and Gadamer. Although both make use of the sudden, both stress the strangeness of the sudden in terms of forgetting and withdrawing. Risser wants his hermeneutics of the strange flash of beauty to rectify that shortcoming. For Risser, the powerful strangeness of beauty is in the appearing itself, that flash in which there is a momentary "unity, and identity, of meaning" despite the fact that language is always "caught up in the interminable interplay of identity and difference" (108).

Given that I have only briefly mentioned the platonic aspect of this book, it should be obvious that I found the readings of Plato by far the least successful parts. They are often appended to the front of the main body of the hermeneutic analysis in each chapter and do not seem to add much or at times even be fully related to the main flow of thought, and they certainly fail as standalone analyses of Plato. They often give the appearance of being an afterthought perhaps intended to give the impression that the book is more of a coherent whole than it is or needs to be. There are exceptions. Risser's reading of the Platonic idea of beauty adds much to his hermeneutics of the vitality of language, and when Risser returns to some of Gadamer's readings of Plato many of the insights are as wonderful as they already were. But for instance, it is odd for Socrates to figure so prominently in a piece which places such emphasis on wandering, which Socrates famously almost never did, and to have no place for Nietzsche, who did so much. The suggestion that weaving is a central recurrent metaphor in Plato seems, at the very least, an overstatement. Apart from the Statesman, its role is negligent to non-existent. That Necessity works a spindle in the Myth of Er is probably a reference to Anaxagorean cosmology, not a direct reference to weaving as such. And although Risser claims that there is also a weaving metaphor in the Phaedo, as he omits to provide a full reference, I wasn't able to remind myself of it. In any case, that hardly makes weaving a central motif. But let me just consider the famously difficult to decipher Myth of Er in a little more detail.

Risser leans very heavily on the fact that on returning to this world the myth's cast of characters drink varying quantities of the waters of Lethe, Er excepted of course. Risser reads Plato as giving anamnesis a role in the practical sphere as well as the intellectual. It is always difficult to know which elements of a platonic myth are significant and which are not. Barring the varying quantity, the most obvious explanation is that in order to make the myth coherent, Plato needs some device to account for the fact that in this world we don't know what will happen to us, whereas when we choose our lives before we return, we get to see them as a whole. For Risser to make his case, he would have had to explain how we choose a whole life in the myth -- and before the waters are drunk, when demythologized, means that we are engaged in a practical anamnesis in this life. But such an analysis is not forthcoming. This is perhaps why references to Gadamer's readings of Plato are more successful because they were extended and we know them already. Of course it could be objected that the question here shouldn't really be, "Is this a correct interpretation of Plato?" The question should be whether this interpretation of Plato can speak to the question of what it means to be. But here again this reading, to my mind, fails the test. "Questioning" is a much richer metaphor for the working of the finite hermeneutics of life than the "measure of careful attentiveness" which in turn is richer than "the quantity of water of Lethe that returning souls drink." The platonic analysis neither stands on its own, nor does it add much to Risser's otherwise masterful hermeneutics of life.