The Life Sciences in Early Modern Philosophy

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Ohad Nachtomy and Justin E.H. Smith (eds.), The Life Sciences in Early Modern Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2014, 256pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199987313.

Reviewed by Domenico Bertoloni Meli, Indiana University, Bloomington


Over the last few years there has been a resurgence of interest in the "life sciences" in the early modern period, involving the study of major figures; practices of experimentation, observation, and visualization; and key notions and processes, including life itself. This volume stems from a workshop held in Princeton, though it also includes several contributions that were not presented on that occasion. The editors bring refreshingly together a number of younger and senior scholars dealing with canonical and less famous figures in the period from Renaissance anatomist Hieronymus Fabricius to Kant.

In the brief introduction the editors draw a distinction between the successes of "mechanical physics" on the one hand, and, on the other, the area of knowledge loosely defined as the "life sciences," which they seem to imply lagged behind. Yet they argue that the philosophical problems posed by the life sciences were at least as significant as those posed by mechanical physics and therefore deserve close attention. While Kant may have balked at a blade of grass, I wonder whether scholars around 1700 would have shared the editors' views. To be sure, starting from Copernicus, the physico-mathematical disciplines had made spectacular advances in understanding celestial motions, though the notion of gravity was every bit as obscure as that of life. But anatomy too had seen major transformations since Vesalius: Harvey's circulation of the blood, the investigation of the micro-structure of the lungs and the process of respiration, the recognition that phlegm does not descend from the brain, the identification of glands, and the experiments on the sexual reproduction of plants and the claim that most of them are hermaphrodites, for example, opened new anatomical and philosophical vistas. Arguably, perceptions of the relative significance of the transformations of the physico-mathematical and life sciences in the early modern period are not a given but changed with time.

The editors have identified four themes that characterize living beings: their nature, their structure, their distinctive ways of operating, especially in the process of generation, and their order or variety. The essays are grouped according to these four categories. Out of twelve essays, three discuss Leibniz and are closely related, though they appear as number one, six, and eleven; moreover, the essay on Kant comes immediately before that on Fabricius. While each reader may prefer his or her own organization, here I discuss the essays in a different order from the one in which they are presented, joining chronological and thematic concerns.

The essays by Peter Distelzweig and Andreas Blank testify to the richness of the scholastic tradition in the early decades of the 17th century. Rather than seeing Fabricius as a "proto-Borelli," as some previous commentators had done, Distelzweig analyses his work on muscles, bone articulations, and animal motion in a more historicist fashion, seeking to reconstruct more accurately the nature of his project in De musculi artificio, et ossium de articulationibus (1614, and De motu locali animalium secundum totum (1618). In particular, while placing Fabricius within the Aristotelian and Galenic traditions, Distelzweig discusses the roles of teleology and of mechanics as subordinate sciences. Blank focuses on the problem of generation in a contemporary of Fabricius, the little known Juan Gallego de la Serna, royal physician to the Spanish kings. Gallego accepted the commonly received view that animals are endowed with a soul; however, he rejected both the notions that seeds are animated and that they have "potencies sufficient for the development of animal souls" (118). Rather, for him the uterus is the external agent responsible for the generation of animal souls. I remain to be convinced, however, that the process of generation of material forms in the uterus is best captured by the notion of "metabolism" (132, 136).

The problem of generation continued to be a puzzle for later philosophers, naturalists, and physicians. Karen Detlefsen has investigated different aspects of the problem in Nicolas Malebranche. She has identified a cluster of arguments in support of "preexistence," namely the notion that all living beings were created by God ab initio: preexistence explains the original sin, in that all human beings were present in the ovaries of Eve (or the loins of Adam); it provides evidence of God's existence through a teleological argument, as evidenced by his remarkable design; it provides a defensible mechanistic account by reducing generation to growth, which is much more amenable to an intelligible mechanical explanation; it avoids the problem of the inter-relatedness of organisms, in that at no time is a part present without the others; it relates to the problem of individuation, at least from Leibniz's perspective. Detlefsen argues that Malebranche endorsed all these motivations for preexistence except the last one. Incidentally (138n6), Marcello Malpighi did not endorse preexistence as defined here; in fact he explicitly distanced himself from Jan Swammerdam, who followed Malebranche in this regard. According to Malpighi, each animal is generated by its parents, and its rudiments are formed by chemical processes among the contents of saccules or vesicles contained in the egg. Malpighi put forward a mechanistic alternative to both epigenesis and preexistence.[1]

The essays by Anne-Lise Rey and Raphaële Andrault analyze three late seventeenth-century English figures who rejected a mechanistic understanding of the body. Rey revisits Glisson's notion of irritability from atomia hepatis (1654) to De ventriculo et intestinis (1677), framing it within a broad set of intellectual traditions including Galen, neo-Scholastics such as Francisco Suárez, William Harvey, and Jean-Baptiste van Helmont. Rey tentatively defends what she calls an "empiricist" understanding of nervous action, whereby the nerves learn through long practice and habit. Further, she argues that "the body can serve as a model of intelligibility for understanding knowledge" (96). In her admirable work Andrault takes the lead from a comment by Pierre Bayle, who lumped together the views of Ralph Cudworth on "plastic nature" and Nehemiah Grew on "vital principle" as examples of a neo-Aristotelian revival of substantial forms. Andrault highlights that despite their common concerns in defending God's excellency and refuting atheism, Cudworth's and Grew's notions differed from Aristotle's and from each other. She also convincingly problematizes the notion of "life", arguing that "For Cudworth, there is something similar between a mineral and a plant " (42), while "In Grew's Cosmologia sacra, life is required to explain the cohesion of bodies" (43).

Catherine Abou-Nemeh extends the investigation of anti-mechanistic themes to the Continent, especially in the works of Nicolaas Hartsoeker in the Netherlands and René-AntoineFerchault de Réaumur in France. The key experiments showing that the amputated claws of crayfish grow back had been known for several decades and were widely accepted, though their interpretations differed. Abou-Nemeh points out that Hartsoeker's beliefs migrated from a broadly Cartesian worldview, to one sympathetic to the opinions of the Cambridge Platonists Henry More and Ralph Cudworth, to the belief that the regrowth of amputated claws was proof of intelligent matter. Réaumur, by contrast, sought to adapt the theory of preexistence by arguing that the new claw grew "from little eggs in the crayfish that contained the limb in miniature" (161). Abou-Nemeh provides a rich cultural and religious context for these philosophical issues.[2] The author's investigations could be extended to a larger set of animals, including humans: bones, for example, can repair themselves in fractures and can also regrow, as Hartsoeker's fellow countrymen Anton de Heide, and many others in the following decades, pointed out between the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries; de Heide also performed experiments on the legs of frogs to study this process.[3]

Ohad Nachtomy, Lea Schweitz, and François Duchesneau address aspects of Leibniz's reflections on life and the notions of mechanism and organism. Nachtomy discusses Leibniz's theory of living beings and his having recourse to infinity. Contemporary debates questioned whether living beings were like machines. Leibniz's solution was that machines constructed by us are not machines in each of their parts or to their ultimate constituents; by contrast, natural machines or living beings have a nested structure whereby their constituents are still machines, to infinity. Leibniz welcomed recent microscopic investigations, which seemed to support his views, though of course his position was not and could not be based on empirical observations, but ultimately relied on metaphysical arguments. Schweitz studies in particular human life and weaves theological considerations into her narrative. She argues that according to Leibniz human life is "both a natural machine and a divine mirror" (206), reflecting and imitating God. Lastly, Duchesneau deftly examines the two key notions of organism and mechanism in the correspondence between Leibniz and the Halle physician Georg Ernst Stahl. Following to a large extent Stahl's Halle colleague and rival Friedrich Hoffmann, Leibniz considered the notion of organism "as a special mechanism proper to organic bodies" (114). By contrast, Stahl drew a sharper distinction between the two notions: "mechanism" implies "all the processes of modification affecting bodies in their materiality, and thus lacking any final determination" (105). Living beings, however, are instruments of their souls and depend "on a functional integration, and not on a mere coordination, of mechanisms" (106). Stahl's notion of organism captures the finality of the processes that characterize living bodies.

The learned essay by Brian Ogilvie shifts the emphasis to the problem of classification. Taxonomic concerns had accompanied the study of higher animals and plants since the Renaissance, but insects posed especially challenging problems because of the huge number of species and because insects undergo metamorphosis, thus posing the question of which stage to consider. Ogilvie's excursus moves from Edward Wotton and Ulisse Aldrovandi to Antonio Vallisneri and Réaumur. While Renaissance naturalists identified metamorphosis, they did not give this process a prominent position in their classifications. In the seventeenth century, however, matters changed: painter Jan Godaert documented metamorphosis visually, while naturalist and microscopist Swammerdam focused on different types of insect development as a taxonomic criterion. Lastly, Vallisnieri adopted what Ogilvie calls an "ecological" classification, based on where the insects live -- though he combined a range of different features in his classification. Lastly, Réaumur relied on the diachronic aspects of metamorphosis, though in this dauntingly large field he also privileged those insects that relate in one way or the other to humans.

Chronologically, the essay by Thomas Teufel on Kant closes the volume. Teufel questions whether Kant's famous statement of the impossibility of "a Newton who could make comprehensible even the generation of a blade of grass according to natural laws that no intention had ordered" (48) was really meant to deny the possibility of biology as a science. His answer is that Kant did not issue such a denial. To be sure, "our phenomenal awareness of organic beings will . . . have to have recourse to critical philosophy cum transcendental principle of purposiveness," thus relying on teleological judgment. However, "A comprehensive account of the corporeal reality of organic beings must appeal to all and only mechanistic causes" (61, italics in the original).

In conclusion, this is a rich, useful, and thought-provoking addition to the growing literature on the life sciences in the early modern period, one that both clarifies and at the same time problematizes a number of key conceptual issues.

[1] Marcello Malpighi, Correspondence, edited by Howard B. Adelmann. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1975. 5 vols, 4:1659-64, at 1662 and n2.

[2] The essay by Charles Wolfe, "Epigenesis as Spinozism in Diderot's Biological Project" is marred by a significant misinterpretation of what Harvey meant by epigenesis. In a nutshell, while Harvey contrasted epigenesis ;with what he called "metamorphosis", Wolfe conflates the two: for Harvey epigenesis depends on the soul or one of its faculties, not, as Wolfe claims, "the power or potentiality of the preexistent matter" (185), which characterizes metamorphosis instead. This objection was raised by Karin Ekholm at the HSS meeting in Boston, 21-24 November 2013, and has been accepted by Wolfe. Therefore, it seems only fair to let the author reframe the essay before reviewing it.

[3] Anton de Heide, Anatome mytuli. Amsterdam: apud Janssonio Waesbergios, 1684, 123-6.