The Limitations of the Open Mind

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Jeremy Fantl, The Limitations of the Open Mind, Oxford University Press, 2018, 229pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198807957.

Reviewed by Jonathan Matheson, University of North Florida


This book is a provocative and timely piece of philosophy that engages a host of debates in epistemology, argumentative theory, and ethics. The book has two parts, one primarily epistemological and one broadly ethical. In the first, Jeremy Fantl examines the concepts of open-mindedness and close-mindedness, and argues that individuals can retain knowledge even when confronted with counterarguments that they spend significant time with, find compelling, and with which they are unable to expose any flaw. In the book's second half, Fantl examines the moral and political consequences of this epistemological conclusion. If one can retain knowledge in such situations, he argues, then one shouldn't engage with such counterarguments -- either open-mindedly or close-mindedly. One shouldn't engage open-mindedly, since doing so demonstrates a willingness to adjust your confidence in a proposition based on reasoning that you know leads to a false conclusion. One shouldn't engage close-mindedly either, since doing so is often manipulative, insincere, disrespectful, and in the end still ineffective.

Chapter 1 argues for a broadly 'Platonic' conception of open-mindedness. Having considered a number of alternative accounts, Fantl's focus is on open-mindedness toward an argument, and he lands on the following account:

You are open-minded toward an argument iff (i) affective factors do not dispose you against being persuaded by the argument, (ii) you are not disposed to unreasonably violate any procedural norms in your response to the argument, and (iii) you are willing to be significantly persuaded conditional on spending significant time with the argument, finding the steps compelling, and being unable to locate a flaw. (12)

If conditions (i)-(iii) hold, you are open-minded, while if any of them fail to obtain, you are close-minded toward the argument. Both open-mindedness and close-mindedness come in degrees.

In Chapter 2, Fantl begins to make his case for his first key premise:

  1. There are important and standard situations in which you know that a relevant counterargument is misleading whether or not you have spent significant time with the argument, found each step compelling, and been unable to expose a flaw. (xi)

In many cases, Fantl argues, being unable to find a flaw in a compelling counterargument does not defeat your knowledge. Fantl labels this view 'forward-looking dogmatism'. He argues that such a dogmatism can be rational since often the best explanation of your situation is that your well-supported belief is correct, and a clever individual has simply come up with a sneakily misleading counterargument. (34) Further, rather than being in conflict with intellectual modesty, such a dogmatism actually embodies it, since for many propositions you know, you could easily fail to identify a flaw in a misleading argument to the contrary ('The Principle of Modesty'). (35) Given the ease at which one may come across an apparently flawless argument to the contrary, actually coming across one does not provide much evidential weight to the contrary. This is why, according to Fantl, your knowledge can survive coming across an apparently flawless counterargument. Fantl's account explains how we can know that motion exists and that people are bald without being able to diagnose flaws in the compelling arguments to the contrary.

In Chapter 3, Fantl argues that a counterargument being too sophisticated for you is actually a reason why you can dismiss it, and do so without losing your knowledge. The greater your amateurism about some matter, the less surprising it should be to find an apparently flawless counterargument. This has the surprising result that the amateur is often in a more fortunate epistemic position than the expert. The motivation here is the same as in the previous chapter -- surprising evidence counts for more than unsurprising evidence, so since the amateur is more likely to come across an apparently flawless counterargument, it counts for less against the amateur's belief.

In Chapter 4, Fantl examines how his argument applies to atheistic belief and the denial of psychic phenomena, while discussing the relevance of 'felt obviousness'. Fantl claims that a felt obviousness, including a priori intuitions, framework judgments, and manifesting correct prior probabilities, is sufficient to avoid defeating effects from such a counterargument. Since most people have facility in dealing with felt obviousness, if such a person lacks facility in dealing with the evidence employed in the counterargument (like the statistical evidence employed in arguments for psi and the fine-tuning argument for God's existence), then they can retain their knowledge and avoid the potentially defeating effects of the counterargument.

Chapter 5 begins the second half of the book where Fantl examines the ethical consequences of the first half. In this chapter Fantl examines three defenses of 'the standard view', which claims that we have an obligation to engage counterarguments. The three strands of motivation for such an obligation come from (i) the very nature of argumentation, (ii) the resulting good consequences of engagement, and (iii) the rights and agency of the interlocutor. But Fantl rejects each motivation in Chapters 6 and 7. In Chapter 6, Fantl argues that they fail to support open-minded engagement in the relevant circumstance, and thus makes the case for his second key premise:

  1. If you know, in a standard situation, that a relevant counterargument is misleading, you shouldn't engage with it open-mindedly. (xi)

Fantl's case here rests on the principle that you should act in accordance with what you know -- that knowledge always provides sufficient epistemic support to be a decisive reason to act. So, if you retain knowledge upon coming across the counterexample, you should act accordingly, and in many cases that will result in non-engagement. To engage with such a counterargument open-mindedly would be to open yourself up to adjusting your confidence in response to an argument that you know leads to a false conclusion.

In Chapter 7, Fantl turns to close-minded engagement and makes the case for his final premise:

  1. If you know that a relevant counterargument is misleading, there are important and standard situations in which you shouldn't engage with it close-mindedly. (xi)

While there are situations where there is an obligation to engage (calling out offensive speech, correcting simple errors, standing in solidarity with those in marginalized groups), in many other standard situations Fantl argues that even close-minded engagement is problematic. Such engagement can be demeaning, dangerous, and manipulative, and so it often ought to be avoided. Close-minded engagement can happen in one of two ways. If you are open about your close-mindedness, your engagement will often be ineffectual. If you mislead your interlocutor into thinking that your engagement is open-minded, then you are engaged in problematic manipulation. So, in many cases of the relevant type, you shouldn't engage close-mindedly either.

The argument concludes that in many important and standard situations you should not engage with a counter-argument either open-mindedly or close-mindedly. Chapter 8 then applies the argument to the issue of inviting controversial speakers to campus. Fantl argues that it is wrong to invite problematic speakers to campus, speakers whose "invitation is viewed as demeaning or marginalizing to some individual or group" (177). According to Fantl, such invitations harm in both their content and context, and constitute a betrayal of the relevant community.

A great deal of recent literature in epistemology is concerned with the potential defeating effects of discovered disagreement.[1] Fantl's topic in this book is different. His focus is on the potential defeating effects of discovering a seemingly flawless counterargument. While there are important connections, these issues are distinct. You can come across a disagreement without being presented with a counterargument, and you can come across a seemingly flawless counterargument without finding someone who actually endorses it (and thus disagrees with you). In fact, Fantl attempts to stay neutral on the central questions in the epistemology of disagreement (conciliation vs. steadfastness, uniqueness vs. permissivism, etc.) (87). However, I will contend that some issues arise for Fantl at the intersection of these debates.

There are cases that Fantl's account seems to get right. I can know that the law of non-contradiction is true even if I find compelling a counterargument by Graham Priest and am unable to find any flaws with it. For Fantl, this is because I have good initial support for my belief (its felt obviousness), and, because I am not an expert logician, I should not be very surprised that I find an apparently flawless counterargument. Since my finding an apparently flawless counterargument should not be very surprising, the higher-order evidence that the counterargument is flawless is quite weak. In fact, it is too weak to defeat my knowledge of the law of non-contradiction.

While Fantl's account gets the right verdict in this case, it gives the wrong explanation. Fantl's account fails to appreciate my reliance on the relevant expert community. While I may find Priest's counterargument flawless, I am also justified in believing that most expert logicians do not find his counterargument flawless. In this case, I can rely on what I am justified in believing about other expert logicians to mitigate the impact of the potential defeater. This can be seen by imagining an alternative case where I am ignorant of what other expert logicians believe about the law of non-contradiction and Priest's counterargument. If I believe in the law of non-contradiction on the basis of its felt obviousness alone, and then come upon Priest's seemingly flawless counterargument, my knowledge does not appear to remain intact (contra the verdict given by Fantl's account). We need to lean on the higher-order evidence of disagreement (or agreement) to avoid the defeating effects of a seeming flawless counterexample.[2]

The difference in explanations is significant in terms of application. On the social epistemology account I have given, happening upon a seemingly flawless counterargument fails to defeat only if there is some other piece of higher-order evidence (like broad expert consensus) that I can use to defeat the potential defeater. On Fantl's account, my amateurism is sufficient to avoid the defeating effects. Fantl's amateurist account[3] also appears to undermine the subject's knowledge in the relevant domain. The fact that it would not be surprising for me to come across an apparently flawless counterargument in some domain cuts both ways. What's good for counterarguments is good for the initial argument as well. For instance, if I am an amateur climate science researcher, and would not be surprised to find seemingly flawless counterarguments to my climate science beliefs, then it does not appear that I would be justified in my climate science beliefs, at least absent the higher-order evidence concerning non-amateurs.[4] The epistemic significance of my amateurism undermines my initial justification. Fantl claims that there can be an important asymmetry here: one could be an amateur with respect to the kinds of evidence and methods used in the counterargument but not an amateur with respect to the kinds of evidence and methods used to provide the initial justification and knowledge. While that may be, it is difficult to see how this has the epistemic upshot that Fantl claims. Without reason to think that the 'familiar' evidence is representative of the total evidence, it does not appear that someone could know on the basis of that evidence.[5] If I know that there is a great deal of evidence relevant to p that I cannot make heads or tails of (and am unaware of how the relevant experts understand it), then Fantl's recommendation is to believe in accordance with what I do understand (however limited and however unrepresentative it may be). This is the wrong verdict. In such cases, suspension of judgment would be appropriate.

This problem becomes more vivid if we imagine a case where both a novice and an expert about p start out knowing p and come across a counterargument that both find apparently flawless. Since this discovery is more surprising for the expert, she is more likely to lose knowledge. Suppose she does. Given that the novice can't really track things either way here, it seems that Fantl's view has it that the novice continues to know p, even while seeing that the (formerly agreeing) expert ceases to know p. This can't be right.

A natural worry is that Fantl's prescription to dismiss counterarguments you know are misleading is that it is prone to abuse. Given that it is not always luminous to us which arguments are the ones we know to be misleading, trying to follow Fantl's prescription can easily lead to us ignoring important arguments that are not at all misleading (in fact, they may be the only hope to correct us from our false views). Fantl tries to assuage this worry by noting that (i) not all controversial beliefs are known (and so you cannot always know that a counterargument to a controversial belief of yours is misleading), (ii) a piece of advice may be true even if it is difficult to follow, and (iii) this is a problem that most substantive normative principles have to face. Fantl argues that your knowledge does not always survive counterevidence, and the principle only applies when your knowledge does survive. That's why he claims that you could not ignore the testimony of a large number of historians who testify that Washington was not the first US President (135). Having heard this expert testimony on a television program, you would lose your knowledge that Washington was the first US President, and thus Fantl's principle would not apply.

Nevertheless, there is a deeper problem here. If we endorse Fantl's premise, then one can (and in fact, should!) simply ignore the relevant counterevidence -- the individual in question shouldn't have listened to the historians' testimony in the first place! Rather, in hearing that there was about to be such testimony, the subject should have just turned the channel. So, the view justifies a kind of ostrich epistemology[6] -- get knowledge and then hide.[7]

There is a great deal to engage with in this book. It will be of interest to epistemologists and ethicists, but those outside of academic philosophy will also enjoy reading and wrestling with its arguments. Fantl's writing is accessible and the topics addressed are timely and significant. Should you read this book? I think so, but whether you should according to Fantl's view is a more complicated matter.


Ballantyne, N. (2015). "The significance of unpossessed evidence" Philosophical Quarterly 65 (260): 315-335.

Carey, B. and J. Matheson. (2013). "How skeptical is the equal weight view?" In D. Machuca (ed.) Disagreement and Skepticism. Routledge, 131-149.

Christensen, D. and J. Lackey. (2013). The Epistemology of Disagreement: New Essays. Oxford University Press.

Feldman, R. and T. Warfield. (2010). Disagreement. Oxford University Press.

Frances, B. (2014). Disagreement. Polity.

Matheson, J. (2015). The Epistemic Significance of Disagreement. Palgrave Macmillan.

[1] See Christensen and Lackey (2013), Feldman and Warfield (2010), Frances (2014), and Matheson (2015).

[2] For a more detailed defense of our reliance on such higher-order evidence, see Carey and Matheson (2013).

[3] This is not to suggest that Fantl is himself an amateur in the debate; in fact he is the expert here!

[4] This follows Ballantyne (2015).

[5] See Ballantyne (2015) for an extended defense of this point.

[6] I get this term from Alvin Goldman who I heard use it to make a similar critique in a different context.

[7] One might take some comfort in the fact that Fantl's principles do require the subject to have knowledge (as opposed to mere justified belief). However, by focusing on knowledge (as opposed to justification), further questions arise. Since there will be cases of non-knowledge that seem to the subject to be knowledge, a question for Fantl's account is what such a subject is justified in believing upon confronting a seemingly flawless counterargument. In other words, it is not clear what work Fantl is placing on externalist factors (including truth) in his argument. At times he implies that individuals on both sides of a debate have the same maneuvers open to them (e.g., in discussing the theist and the atheist).