The Logic of Being: Realism, Truth, and Time

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Paul M. Livingston, The Logic of Being: Realism, Truth, and Time, Northwestern University Press, 2017, 257pp., $99.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780810135208.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Bell, Southeastern Louisiana University


Paul Livingston draws from an impressive array of philosophical work to address his 'central problem,' which is, as he states it, 'that of the relationship of thought to time, whereby both being and becoming are to be thought and understood within the life of a being that is itself temporally situated' (xi). Although this book can be read as a book on Heidegger, for Heidegger's work looms largest in Livingston's approach to tackling his central problem, it is also a book that demonstrates the centrality of its concerns to both the analytic and continental traditions in philosophy. Livingston draws freely and liberally from Frege, Davidson, Dummett, Wittgenstein, and importantly and strategically from Cantor and Gödel. What Livingston offers us, therefore, is an example of the pluralistic philosophy he has called for in his other works.

Livingston sets the stage for his discussions with Plato's Sophist, and in particular with the Visitor's suggested solution to the problem of how to resolve the difficulties associated with accounting for how we are able to reconcile thought with a reality that is (or appears to be) changing all the time. In response to the Parmenidean claim that it is impossible to speak or know about change, since this would entail speaking about something that is not, the Visitor suggests employing what Livingston refers to as 'a superior logical-syntactical grammar of essential types,' which makes knowledge possible as the types being, rest, and change 'enter into differential logical or conceptual relationships with one another in the medium of the soul' (7). Therefore, in order to reconcile the nature of a thought that involves stable, timeless categories and the temporal, changing world, including the situated subject who thinks and knows this world, the Visitor proposes a deep 'logical-syntactical grammar' of essential types as the condition that makes the relationship between the knowing subject and the world possible. It is this grammar that will become crucial, Livingston argues, to understanding the developments of twentieth century philosophy; and it is, in particular, Heidegger's logic or grammar of being, coupled with a post-Cantorian dialetheism that Livingston develops in later chapters, that provides what Livingston argues is the most fully developed response to the problem of the 'relationship of thought to time.'

As Livingston turns to Heidegger, a key focus is what he sees as Heidegger's 'concern with the question of the source and provenance of categories in relation to the psychology and phenomenology of the thinking subject' (36). What Heidegger is careful to avoid in addressing this question is a psychologistic reduction of categories to psychological processes. This was the Visitor of the Sophist's solution, and Heidegger sought to avoid a psychologistic account, following in the footsteps of Husserl (Heidegger's teacher) and Frege. An adequate logic of being should not presuppose a being -- the psychological subject -- that remains unaccounted for. It is for this reason that Livingston stresses a reading of Heidegger's conception of being (presencing) as intensional. For as with Frege's theory of sense, whereby sense consists of being an intensional entity that is neither the object signified nor the utterance or psychological processes associated with the utterance, so too for Heidegger, on Livingston's reading, the presencing of being is neither to be confused with beings, nor is it reducible to the psychological processes of a subject -- yet another being. Although seeking to avoid psychologism, Heidegger was nonetheless committed to understanding the manner in which the theoretical (our use of categories) is already 'given in pretheoretical experience and in the kind of availability of objects that is displayed in ordinary, nontheoretical life' (37).

It is at this point where Livingston sets forth the crucial argumentative strategy of his book, what he calls the method of 'formal indication' as found in Heidegger's work. Put briefly, formal indication is to be contrasted, in part, with generalization. 'To generalize about the triangle,' Livingston claims, 'would be to relate it as exemplary of a species to various higher genera' (40), such as plane figure, geometric shape, etc. To formalize, by contrast, would be, for instance 'to show that [the triangle's] right angle is equal to the sum of its other two angles' and thus the method of formal indication is used to identify a triangle's 'formally relevant features and demonstratively indicate their structure' (40-41). Applied to the pretheoretical experience presupposed by our use of categories, the method of formal indication is used to demonstrate the formal structure and logic of being, including our being (or Dasein for the early Heidegger).

What the method of formal indication reveals, Livingston argues, is a formal structure and logic of being that is, fundamentally, paradoxical. After comparing Heidegger and Davidson on their respective understanding of truth, where, for both, truth is understood as a transcendental condition for the possibility of intelligibility and communication, Livingston argues that 'the common structure of truth' Davidson and Heidegger presuppose is itself 'grounded . . . in the ontological difference and can be formally articulated through the metalogical structure of paradox that marks the formal logic of truth in its own self-application' (96). As Livingston restates this paradox a few pages later, it consists of 'the paradox that the measure itself cannot be measured in its own terms' (101). For example, and in a nod to Reiner Schürmann's reading of Heidegger, the measure Livingston has in mind here is the 'epochal principle' or 'hegemonic phantasm' which is the particular entity that has been elevated 'to the rank of an absolute measure or standard for the interpretation of all beings' (101). In other words, what is formally indicated in each pretheoretic experience is the ontological difference, or the presencing of presence whereby presencing (being) is not to be confused with that which is given in presence (beings). The presencing of presence (being), however, has throughout the history of metaphysics come to be identified and confused with a particular entity (e.g., God, Plato's Forms, etc.) which is taken to be the standard of measure for all beings. This standard of measure cannot itself be measured in its own terms, and thus we have the metalogical paradox that is revealed through formal indication.

Livingston enhances this reading of Heidegger and lends his arguments even greater significance by connecting the metalogical paradox to Cantor, Gödel, and the dialetheism of Graham Priest. Of particular relevance is Priest's notion of the inclosure paradox. Inclosure paradoxes arise, Priest argues, at the point of reflection on a totality where it can be shown that, at this point, there is an element that exists both within and without the totality. As Livingston develops these arguments, he shows that the relationship between thought to that which is encompassed by the categories of thought is, in turn, made possible by its own inclosure paradox. For Livingston, the method of formal indication as applied to 'the actual relation of thinkable forms to beings as a whole' (124) involves its own true contradiction, or the metalogical paradox that both allows the relation of thought to beings while preventing the relation itself from being thought without contradiction.

Part 2 concerns time, and this is where Livingston puts forth his defense of what he will call 'metaformal realism' (135). Here he develops a version of Gödel's "dichotomy argument" and also refers to the results of Cantor's transfinite mathematics and Tarski's theory of truth, all of which support Livingston's metaformal realism, which he summarizes as follows:

If, as I have argued, the complex of results running from Cantor, through Gödel, to Tarski, shows the irreducibility of this access to any finite specifiable procedure, it also thus motivates a realism about sense and its givenness that outstrips any determination of this givenness in terms of (finitely specifiable) capacities, abilities, faculties, or practices. (145)

With these arguments in hand, Livingston returns to the central problem of his book, namely the 'relation of thought to time' (xi). In particular, what Livingston argues is that 'the metaphysical duality that opposes the temporal finitude of the sensory to the eternity of the intelligible can cede to a metaformally and ontologically deeper structure of originally given time' (148). More precisely, originally given time is given paradoxically, and it is this paradox that accounts for the possibility of the relationship between thought and time. Livingston argues that there are two fundamental paradoxes associated with the 'deeper structure of originally given time.' There is the cosmological paradox of the totality of time, most frequently associated with Kant's cosmological antinomies. Livingston, however, does not accept Kant's solution to the antinomy, what he refers to as the 'strategy of parameterization', which denies the reality of the world of appearances in favor of a higher, inaccessible realm of things-in-themselves. What Livingston endorses, instead, is a version of Priest's inclosure paradox, where the totality of world-time involves both inclosure and transcendence, or time is indeed given as time of the world but also, paradoxically, given as that which transcends or is irreducible to the world (164). Livingston employs a similar move for the second paradox, what he calls the 'kairological paradox of passage or of becoming in the now' (165). Here the reality of the now involves, paradoxically, the 'totality of all that is happening now [and] Transcendence is guaranteed by becoming -- that is, by the fact that the "now," along with everything it comprehends, is (right now) becoming something other than now' (165-6). And all of this, again, is paradoxically enclosed within the totality of what is happening now. It is this paradoxical givenness of time that Livingston calls upon, in the end, in his response to the challenge of relating thought to time, or the timeless categories of thought to the changing realities this thought captures. The ground of this relationship, Livingston argues,

is not subjective experience or intuition, but rather the ontological ground, tracing ultimately to the ontological difference, that is indicated in the analysis of the contradictory givenness of time carried out above . . . With their ontological and metalogical structure thus clarified and as a part of a broader attitude of metaformal realism, temporal change and becoming can be treated as fully real, while nevertheless avowedly paradoxical and contradictory (168-9).

Livingston's arguments are deep and technical. He displays a clear mastery of the literature and of the problems of both the analytic and continental traditions. Livingston also diagnoses, in part, some of the reluctance among traditional analytic philosophers to venture down the path Livingston himself has taken. The reason, in short, is that the path he takes involves embracing fundamental paradoxes, and such paradoxes are routinely dismissed, Livingston claims, because of 'the assumption that phenomena characterized by inherently contradictory structure cannot be real' (171). By drawing meticulously and thoroughly from the very traditions that frequently dismiss his path, Livingston shows the path to be an inviting one and he has opened the potential for further dialogue across what were once widely separate philosophic traditions. If there is a shortcoming in this book, it is perhaps that these implications are not explicitly identified and developed. Livingston does close with a brief discussion of politics, applying the same metaformal critique of finite systems to the system of global capitalism and its totalizing tendencies. This discussion is all too brief and yet it may just be an invitation to subsequent work, work that remains largely undeveloped here. What is developed here, however, is significant and promises to forever alter our assumptions about the analytic-continental divide.