The Logical Foundations of Bradley's Metaphysics: Judgment, Inference, and Truth

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James W. Allard, The Logical Foundations of Bradley's Metaphysics: Judgment, Inference, and Truth, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 262pp, $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 052183405

Reviewed by David Crossley, University of Saskatchewan


In the preface to his new book on F. H. Bradley, Professor Allard explains that his aim is to "lay out the main lines of Bradley's argument in The Principles of Logic and connect it with the forms of idealism that preceded it and with the pragmatism and analytic philosophy that followed it" (Allard, x). Moreover, as the title indicates, he also intends to demonstrate how the solutions Bradley arrived at on a number of the problems of logic provide the grounding for the metaphysical arguments of his later works, especially Appearance and Reality. However, the great success of Professor Allard's book lies not so much with his establishing the connection between Bradley's logic and his metaphysics -- although it does an admirable job of this -- but with the interweaving of a scholarly discussion of the historical literature with a rigorous critical study of the development of Bradley's unique views on the central elements of logical thinking: namely, judgment and inference. The result is a book which speaks not merely to a small group of philosophers with a special interest in Bradley, nor only to those with an interest in the history of philosophy during the latter part of the nineteenth century; but a book which also speaks to modern analytic philosophers with an interest in questions about argumentation, meaning, reference, truth and the like.

One especially important historical point is the influence of the writings of T. H. Green on Bradley. Few commentators have paid enough attention to what Bradley learned from T. H. Green, but Professor Allard shows that Green was important for two reasons. First, Green endorsed the idealist position, found in Hegel, that the real is the rational. Here Green's influence is somewhat indirect, coming from his deeply felt concern about religion (which feelings Bradley seemed never to have shared). In this regard Green was responding to the Victorian crisis of faith generated by German Biblical scholarship, which was advocating that the Bible be subjected to critical study like any another work of history, and by the advance of the empirical sciences, especially evolutionary biology. Green's response starts, however, a long way from religion. First, in developing a theory of action -- which he thought a necessary requirement of any study of ethics -- Green had convinced himself that knowledge of nature demands a conscious subject that is separate from the natural order, which could account for the identity of a conscious self over time and also conceptualize the contents of sensory experience by establishing the relations holding them together. Then, extending this thinking to the natural world itself, a parallel argument supposedly showed the need of an "Eternal Consciousness" outside of the natural order which could generate the relations that constitute reality, and thereby make knowledge possible. Thus, as Professor Allard notes, religion could hardly feel threatened by the new science if the very existence of any form of knowledge entails the existence of the Eternal Consciousness (identified with God). One consequence of this view is that reality and God's thought are identical. This identification of thought and reality was something Bradley never could accept, and it was the one thing he always cited as the main barrier to his having been more inclined to Hegelianism. And one important theme of Professor Allard's book centers on why Bradley rejected this view.

However, when we turn to evaluating the arguments of the empiricists, Green had a more direct and more positive influence on Bradley's thinking. For example, one of Green's main arguments in his introductory essays to his and Gross's edition of Hume's Treatises was that Hume could not explain how, from a mere series of fleeting impressions, we could come to know or come to experience a world of objects as one world presented to an enduring subject of experience. Green recognized that it was not ideas as psychic phenomena that were important, as the classical empiricists had believed, but that the key lay with the mind's ability to conceptualize its experiences, with the mind's ability to represent states of affairs and generate ideas in the logical sense of symbols which can carry meaning and be referred to reality. It is this view of judgment with which Bradley begins The Principles of Logic. Unfortunately, Green was not really able to free himself of the empiricist's picture of ideas as discrete items that the mind conjoins in various ways, and was thereby left with the belief that the relations that the mind supplied were central constitutive features of reality. It is here that Bradley breaks with Green, for although Bradley accepts Green's view that judgments involve "ideal objects" that are referred to reality, much of what Bradley later says against the reality of relations, as well as what he says against the view that thought is identical to reality, is as much aimed at Green as against Hegel.

It is not surprising, then, that Bradley begins the Logic with a discussion of judgment, and the central chapters of Professor Allard's book deal with the problem of the truth conditions of judgments and with the analysis of the different types of judgments. One interesting topic encountered in these chapters is the reductio about relations that is usually referred to as "Bradley's regress" and which is likely best known in the form it later took in Chapter III of Appearance and Reality. As mentioned, Bradley had taken from Green the preliminary account of judgment as a mental act that refers an ideal object (i.e., an 'idea' in its logical sense, as a bearer of meaning, rather than its psychological sense of a particular impression, etc.) to reality, as that reality is conceived beyond the mental act itself. It is in the context of presenting and rejecting a rival conception of judgment that the regress about relations is introduced. The surprise is that Bradley's target is T.H. Huxley. In his introduction to Hume, Green had argued that ideas of relations posed a problem, and Huxley had rushed to Hume's defense by arguing for what Hume had rejected, namely, the existence of impressions of relations. Huxley believed that introspective evidence revealed feelings of succession and of similarity, which might occur, for example, in experiencing a number of lighting flashes. The problem with this quickly becomes obvious: the "feelings" of relations are not only supposed to be what keeps a bundle of ideas and impressions unified, but are themselves discrete additional elements in the bundle. It is in this context that Bradley introduces the regress, for these new elements -- the feelings of relations -- must be united with the other ideas and impressions, and if this is achieved by means of new relational feelings of the same sort, we now need even further relations to produce the unity sought, and the regress has begun.

Having settled the historical context of the debate which generates the famous regress, Professor Allard now turns to a detailed logical analysis of the reductio argument that Bradley is employing, setting out Bradley's position formally, in eleven distinct propositions. This approach allows a detailed discussion of the premises but, more importantly, it allows Professor Allard to draw a number of far more general and more significant conclusions. First, if one assumes with the empiricists that judgments and minds contain a plurality of ideas and that the only problem is to explain how unity is produced, one has a problem that one cannot solve from this perspective. But it is a perspective that Bradley believed has things topsy-turvy, for the judgment really contains but one idea. This is because from within the context of immediate experience, which exhibits diversity without relations, the judgment actually abstracts various elements, synthesizes them and refers them to reality. This will mean that all judgments are conditionals, and that truth cannot be explicated in terms of correspondence.

This first consequence, if applied only to universal categorical propositions, would not surprise the modern reader who is familiar with the idea of a standard-form Aristotelian A proposition, such as "all cats are mammals", being understood as making no commitment to whether or not the classes designated by the terms have members and thereby reading it as only asserting that if something were a cat then it would also be a mammal. Professor Allard notes that this, however, was not the standard way of understanding these judgments in Bradley's day, for they were normally taken as having existential import. What is surprising, however, is Bradley's belief that singular categorical judgments also have to be analyzed as conditionals. This is a more complex topic and here again Professor Allard clearly identifies the central issues and offers a reconstruction of Bradley's argument. Following Sigwart, Bradley identifies three types of singular categorical judgments. "Analytic judgments of sense" select elements from what is presently experienced, synthetic judgments of sense connect what is directly experienced with something not perceived -- "This road leads to London" is Bradley's example -- and a third class of singular categorical judgments is not about sensible events at all --e.g., "God is spirit". The problem is how some of these refer to reality. Since anything beyond perceptual experience here and now can only be an ideal construction, these judgments have to be connected with what is presently perceived and some points of identity must be found to provide the connections. (Here it might be interesting to compare Bradley's view of the criterion of truth for historical claims, as set out in his The Presuppositions of Critical History, for this too requires connection to the present experience of the historian.)

The second consequence is that if judgment goes all the way down to the level of perception -- i.e., if observation claims have the same underlying conditional form and entail analysis of what is immediately experienced -- then they cannot be true in virtue of copying or mapping onto a set of distinct independent objects or referents. If the mind is abstracting from what is offered in immediate experience -- which is a felt unity without relations and which is, from the side of what will turn out to be the subject of the experience, a noncognitive mental state without an intentional or any other type of object -- then this requires some different, non-correspondence, conception of truth. Moreover, if thought is relational, it necessarily fails to capture the unity of immediate experience and, therefore, the thesis of Hegel and Green that thought is identical to reality has to be rejected.

Professor Allard's important insight here is that this problem of the relationship between thought and reality -- which Bradley called the central problem of Appearance and Reality -- can also be approached from the standpoint of a theory of truth. Here Professor Allard argues that Bradley, having identified thought with judgment and thought with truth, then identifies truth and thought and contrasts these with what they are about, namely reality. In Professor Allard's words, the "solution to his great problem thus depends on his account of what is true, namely, a judgment, and what is, namely, reality. It also specifies a very novel relation between a true judgment and reality. The relation is identity. At its ideal limit -- that is, in its complete form -- a judgment is made true by reality which is identical to it." (Allard, 181-2). Unfortunately, this complete form cannot be achieved because judgments always involve abstraction, ideal contents, and therefore, relations. This means that judgments are never identical to reality and the most that we can get is some measure of truth, some partial truth. In this way Bradley is backed into his doctrine of the degrees of truth.

The concept of truth bridges the logical foundations and Bradley's metaphysics and Professor Allard's final chapter on truth is a fitting climax to his discussions. But it is also a difficult topic, if only because other commentators and critics have pretty much charged Bradley with holding every other conceivable theory of truth, including correspondence, coherence and pragmatic theories. It is easy to see how confusion can arise. If the task of thought is to express the truth about reality, then it has to capture the fact that reality will have the non-relational unity of immediate experience, which immediate experience has because it is a noncognitive experience of a nonrelational diversity. So one might be tempted into thinking that judgments are true if they capture immediate experience, here taking "capture" to indicate some sort of resemblance or correspondence. Professor Allard argues convincingly that this option is in effect rejected by Bradley at the end of Chapter II of the Logic, and it is easy to see that even if Bradley believed, as I think he did, that we can experience reality as a diversity in unity in immediate experience, he would never claim that we could think it at this level. And once thought begins to articulate the diversity of immediate experience it employs mental operations such as abstraction and analysis that introduce relations, and this is destructive of unity at once.

The result is that any of thought's judgments are merely working hypotheses that are built on certain assumptions or suppositions. (Here we must remember Professor Allard's reconstruction of Bradley's arguments for claiming that all judgments are conditionals, which are, in turn, abbreviated inferences.) So, these assumptions must be revealed, which means that what is eventually required is a completed system of judgments. And here is the point that has likely led many to believe that Bradley accepted a coherence theory of truth. But this is wrong, for on that view truth is established within the system of judgments, as it were, and that is impossible. Bradley may well have believed that coherence was the test of our being justified in holding to a particular judgment, and I think he thought that coherence also crossed the cognitive-noncognitive border, with feelings being able to provide a 'jar' that warned us that something we were thinking was not fitting appropriately with the "felt unity" of immediacy. But the nature of truth cannot be explicated in terms of coherence, for that would involve thinking of a system of judgments mapping onto the system that is reality --unless one were to opt for subjective idealism, which Bradley never does. In this way a coherence theory entails a dualism that indicates at once that it cannot be an expression of the nature of reality. Moreover, no matter how comprehensive a system of judgments becomes, it remains a system of judgments, and the logical nature of judgments creates a difference between what the judgments assert and the reality they are attempting to express.

What is then needed is a representation (if this term can even be used of a system of judgments) which comes right up to reality in the sense that there no longer remains a gap between the system of judgments and that which it expresses. In other words, the two would have to be identical. Professor Allard does not tell us what happens next, but it would seem to me that at this point we would no longer have two things and so strictly speaking even the identity disappears at the end. (Bradley did always say that it took two to be the same and that a thing could not be identical with itself.) But if this is the terminus it accomplishes the one thing that Bradley said he was always seeking -- namely, to get rid of any form of dualism. Professor Allard has rightly seen that the concept of reality has, for Bradley, the logic of a limiting case. But at this logical terminus thought ends and the final experience will not be thought about reality. At the stage beyond both immediate experience and relational thought truth, dies along with thought.

In the above I have only noted a very few general themes that I find to be of special interest. But this fails to do justice to the richness of Professor Allard's book, which is clearly the best study of Bradley we now have and the most important work of Bradley scholarship since Richard Wollheim's F. H. Bradley, published almost 50 years ago. It brings new interpretations and insights to the texts and is replete with important and often novel reconstructions of Bradley's central arguments. All in all this is a wonderfully interesting book and anyone would profit from reading it.