The Magic Prism: An Essay in the Philosophy of Language

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Howard Wettstein, The Magic Prism: An Essay in the Philosophy of Language, Oxford University Press, 2004, 256pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195160525.

Reviewed by Hans-Johann Glock, University of Reading


Wettstein's book is devoted to the 'direct reference revolution' against the descriptivism of Frege and Russell. His main contention is that standard proponents of that revolution such as Donnellan, Kripke, Kaplan, and Perry still accept too much of the Fregean orthodoxy. In particular, they remain wedded to a 'linguistic Cartesianism' according to which thought is better known than language. According to Wettstein, the direct reference revolution needs to be radicalized. More specifically, it needs to be socialized. He rejects the 'individualism' and 'thought orientation' that marks not just the Fregean tradition but also much of the direct reference response to it. Drawing on Wittgenstein, he propounds a 'social practice orientation', which explains the capacity of words to stand for things by reference to a social practice rather than the mental grasp individuals have of the things they talk about (3-5, 60-7). Both traditionalists and direct reference revolutionaries have tried to solve the familiar Fregean puzzles (about identity statements, empty names, and belief ascriptions) and the overarching puzzle of how it is possible for words to stand for things through ever more sophisticated and arcane theories. Wettstein proposes to dissolve these puzzles by showing that our capacity to talk about things is ultimately mundane and bereft of mystery. His book is thus a unique attempt to combine a sophisticated historical and substantive discussion of reference with a loosely speaking Wittgensteinian perspective on language and philosophical problems. Both orthodox philosophers of mind and language and Wittgensteinians have much to learn from the result. Wettstein is also one of those increasingly rare mainstream analytic philosophers to speak with a voice which is distinctive without being obtrusive, and to display how even highly récherché debates can profit from the occasional input of common sense and wisdom.

Chapters 1 and 2 argue that Frege and Russell, in spite of their differences over the components of propositions (respectively, senses and objects/properties), share an underlying assumption, namely the 'intentionality intuition … that if one is to speak or think about a thing, one must possess a discriminating cognitive fix on the thing' (57). Chapter 3 introduces two conflicting perspectives on language -- Cartesian and social. It also puts pressure on the 'Cartesian' idea that one can only use an expression to refer if one is able to distinguish its referent from all other things. Wettstein employs some standard direct reference arguments to show that this 'cognitive fix requirement' falls foul of 'our actual linguistic practice'. First, speakers can refer to things of which they have no uniquely identifying description. Secondly, people can have mistaken ideas about the items they refer to. Thus a philosophy student who confuses Socrates and Plato and asserts 'Aristotle taught Plato' would be uttering a trivial truth if 'Aristotle' was a mere surrogate of the descriptions he associates with the name. In fact, however, he is making a false claim about Aristotle. Thirdly, even speakers who can uniquely and correctly identify Aristotle may not be able to say how they identify him on a particular occasion. Chapter 4 introduces Wettstein's alternative. It bears the motto 'linguistic contact without cognitive contact' and amounts to an austere version of Millian direct reference. Rather than exploiting Kripke's idea of a rigid designator, Wettstein sticks to the idea that ordinary names are mere tags for their bearers, connected to them without the aid of any intermediaries. Furthermore, he places Millianism in the context of his social-practice picture of language. What renders reference possible in the absence of individual cognitive contact is the embededness of signs in our linguistic activities. Cognitively innocent reference is not mysterious. On the contrary, it fulfils an obviously important function, namely to allow speakers of widely divergent cognitive backgrounds to converse about the same objects, if only to be able to ask questions like 'Who was Aristotle?'.

The Wittgensteinan inspiration behind this perspective is ably defended in chapter 5. It entreats us to accept a Wittgensteinian dissolution of the general problem of linguistic intentionality. 'Creatures of a certain neurological complexity, appropriately socialized, use pieces of nature as symbols for other pieces of nature. People, that is, use symbols to stand for things. Think of this … as primitive for philosophy, not as something for which philosophy owes or might provide an explanation in simpler and more primitive terms' (108).

This is not to deny that there is explanatory work here for the sciences, which investigate the neurological preconditions of our linguistic abilities. Nor does it resolve the more specific Fregean puzzles about reference, such as those of informative identity (chapter 6) and empty names (chapter 7). According to Wettstein, previous proponents of direct reference have complicated rather than resolved these puzzles, because they have combined a Russellian conception of propositional content with Fregean modes of presentation. For socialized Millianism informative identity precipitates no such epicycles on epicycles. If one can talk about Cicero merely by having 'Cicero' in one's vocabulary, then it is obvious how one can pick up two names that, unbeknownst to the speaker, have the same referent.

True enough, but insufficient to resolve what, by Wettstein's own lights, is Frege's central conundrum: how to account for the difference in propositional content between 'Hesperus is Phosphorus' and 'Hesperus is Hesperus'. At best it suggests a meta-linguistic account of that difference, namely that the former but not the latter sentence implicitly yet informatively declares two different names to have the same bearer. For better or worse, however, this is a suggestion which Wettstein, along with the mature Frege, rejects.

Wettstein's account of empty names is even less compelling. They are treated as non-paradigmatic cases of using names, which are nonetheless close enough to the central cases to work. Alas, empty names differ precisely in the one respect which renders unmediated reference possible: there are no referents to which they can simply be attached like a tag. Similarly, Wettstein assimilates the use of names in negative existential statements like 'Vulcan does not exist' to fictional statements like 'Hamlet hates his step-father', and treats both as cases of pretence. But far from pretending that 'Vulcan' is the Millian tag for an object, someone who utters the negative existential precisely denies that there is any bearer for that tag. And it is difficult to resist the conclusion that such a denial is possible only because any such bearer would have to satisfy certain conditions.

On the other hand, Wettstein does an excellent job at showing that any solution to the daunting puzzles surrounding belief attributions should preserve semantic innocence, respect standard verdicts on their truth-value, and honour their context-sensitivity. For one thing, he argues convincingly that failure of substitutivity cannot be explained away by appeal to Gricean conversational implicatures. Direct reference theorists are prone to reason as follows. If 'Sam believes that Cicero was a Roman orator' is true then so is 'Sam believes that Tully was a Roman orator', even if Sam fervently repudiates the belief attributed to him. Appearances to the contrary arise only because the second belief attribution carries the conversational implicatures that Sam would assent to 'Tully was a Roman orator' or to a sentence with the same content (since Sam might not speak English). However, apprised of these circumstances most competent speakers would reject the second attribution as downright false rather than misleading. Furthermore, they entertain no thoughts whatever about the relation between belief and propositional contents expressible in a miscellany of natural languages; consequently, when uttering or hearing 'Sam believes that Tully was a Roman orator' they certainly do not insinuate or pick up the implicatures imputed to them.

A second strength of Wettstein's account is its acknowledgement of the context sensitivity of belief attributions. Contrary to Fregeanism, we can sometimes report Sam's belief in terms that run counter to those he would accept himself. The limits of substitution within the context clause are not dictated by an entity -- a propositional content -- but vary according to the communicative situation. In 'A says that/believes that p' the components of 'p' retain their standard meaning, yet the sentence as a whole is 'displayed' or exhibited rather than referred to. By contrast to Davidson's paratactic account, the 'that' is not a device of reference; consequently the attribution as a whole does not express a relation to either an abstract entity or a sentence. Wettstein also denies that it ascribes to A a dispositional mental state. 'To say what someone believes is not to take a stand on a mental state that underlies the surface phenomena in question … . It is rather just to speak for the agent on the question at hand' (213).

According to Wettstein, belief ascriptions simply put sentences into the subject's mouth. But whereas translation or paraphrase furnish standards for doing so in oratio obliqua, belief ascription turns into a 'conjurer's trick' (205-6), something which is no less mysterious for being self-professed. One alternative is to take seriously an aspect of our actual practice that many direct reference theorists, including Wettstein, have played down, namely speakers' intentions as manifested in speakers' explanations. Belief ascriptions seek to capture a genuine phenomenon, although (in Aristotelian terms) it is more of a potentiality rather than actuality: A believes that p if A would sincerely avow that p under suitable circumstances. In oratio obliqua we may follow Kripke and Wettstein and distinguish speaker reference -- what A meant to refer to -- from semantic reference -- what A actually referred to. In the case of belief, however, what counts is an equivalent of speaker reference, and hence speakers' explanations of what they were thinking about. This approach would also allow one to situate propositions in our practices, rather than to dismiss them, as Wettstein ends up doing in his final chapter. Propositions are simply sayables and thinkables; and their identity is just as determinate as the explanations that speakers can proffer of what they are thinking or what they have said.

Such qualms notwithstanding, Wettstein has provided a highly illuminating and thought-provoking anthropology of our practice of using words to refer to things. It provides the perfect antidote to the widespread tendency of distorting this practice because of theoretical fancies and l'art pour l'art technicalities.