The Main Business of Natural Philosophy: Isaac Newton's Natural-Philosophical Methodology

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Steffen Ducheyne, The Main Business of Natural Philosophy: Isaac Newton's Natural-Philosophical Methodology, Springer, 2012, 352pp., $189.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789400721258.

Reviewed by Marius Stan, Boston College


Newton's gravitation theory was a spectacular success by any measure, and so, as philosophy of science came of age, people naturally wanted to know what enabled his feat. How did Newton get it so right? Many have offered answers, variously construing his method as induction, abduction, probabilistic reasoning, a combination of deduction and transduction or even, faute de mieux, as a "Newtonian style" sui generis. Into the fray now wades Steffen Ducheyne, promising to cast fresh light on Newton's views based on extensive manuscript material not studied before. His general thesis is that a unitary method is at work in Newton's dynamics but that his work in optics and theology did not live up to its strong requirements.

Chapter I explicates the views on method and causal realism in the Principia. Ducheyne argues that Newton's idea of analysis and synthesis in natural philosophy did not stem from his views on method in mathematics, as some have said. Rather, Newton was influenced by a tradition of Aristotelian textbooks, among them Samuel Smith'sAdditus ad logicam, which he owned and studied (16). According to it, the proper method of science was "demonstrative regress" in two steps: "analysis" from known facts to universal causes, and a "synthetic" return to particular facts, which are thus explained causally. Newton adopts this terminology, and Ducheyne claims it captures the essence of the reasoning in Book III of the Principia, whose Propositions I-VIII are the analytic part, in which Newton infers from Kepler orbits to centripetal forces as their causes. The synthetic step stretches, allegedly, from the argument for universal gravity to the end of Book III. And the theorems of Book I mediate the inferential passage from effect to cause and back. These causes -- centripetal forces, or instances of gravity -- are verae causae, but Newton demurs from claiming to have "explained" gravity. As Ducheyne explains, Newton had a layered view of explanation: gravity was just the proximate cause of orbiting, but full explanations must go all the way down to ultimate causes, which Newton professes to be ignorant of.

Chapters II and III take a closer look at method in Newton's gravitation theory. In II, Ducheyne details Newton's activity of "model construction" (68) for motion in orbit. Such models share the purely mathematical lemmas on limits and integrals, and the "physical" definitions and laws of motion. The models yield "causal inference tickets," or biconditionals whereby Newton relates kinematic orbits and dynamical forces (exact and quam proxime) and systematic deviations from either (81). Chapter III reconstructs Newton's "model application" in Book III, where he uses the "merely abstract" entities of his models to infer to "real forces in the systema mundi" from apparent Kepler motions (108). These particular forces are then proven to be local instances of one force: gravitation. As the models of Book I cannot entail universal gravity by themselves, Newton reaches for additional premises -- his four regulae philosophandi, whose birth and evolution in his thought Ducheyne chronicles in learned detail. With his physical theory in place, Newton then explains true deviations from inertial states as the manifold effects of a universal cause or force.

As Ducheyne sees it, the specific of Newton's method is this. First, there are two constraints on causal reasoning in physics:

  1. Contra Cartesian hypothetico-deductivism, Newton asks that the forces (and physical causes generally) proffered in explanations be shown to be necessary too, not just sufficient. Mere sufficiency would make them mere "hypotheses," which Newton bans from rigorous theory.[1]
  2. He demands that all inference to causes must be mediated by three highly established facts: the laws of motion.

These two requirements delimit what counts as "deduced from phenomena" or inferable from observation and experiment, and they prove "systematic dependencies between cause and effect" (183).

Second, all causes so inferred must then be generalized inductively as the universal causes of the phenomena they produce. The Principia's four "rules for the study of natural philosophy" both license and constrain such inductive moves. Chapter V reconstructs the evolution of Newton's conception of method, from his optimism about mathematizing optics, in the early to mid-1670s, to the rise of his mature methodology in the period 1684-7, to the sophisticated "inductive provisionalism" (231) that emerges in the second edition of the Principia (1713).

With Chapter IV, we begin to see the limits of Newton's method. Ducheyne shows, insightfully, that certain elements in the Principia carry over into the Opticks (206): e.g., analysis (from refraction phenomena to a theory of white light) and synthesis (explaining the rainbow from the heterogeneity of white light). However, in other respects, the Opticks came up methodologically short. Newton could not "deduce from phenomena" that heterogeneous, discrete color rays are co-present in white light before refraction (186). Nor could he infer to the micro-constituents of light by a legitimate "transduction," as Ducheyne calls it (206), appealing instead to a mere "analogy of nature." Critically, Newton could not relate these micro-constituents to macroscopic phenomena through the laws of motion -- as his strict methodology requires -- having to content himself with just a kinematic optics.

Finally, in Chapter VI Ducheyne tackles some thorny issues of Newton's theology. He documents in rich detail the gradual emergence of theological themes in theScholium Generale, initially drafted as a modest, innocuous affair to conclude the Principia. He also highlights Newton's allegiance to, and oblique voicing of, heterodox tenets about God, the Trinity, and ecclesiology -- all matters on which, in private, the father of orbital dynamics could get rather worked up.[2] There is the inevitable swipe at Descartes, denounced as an author of "anti-Mosaic idolatry" (261), presumably a grave sin. More to the point, though, Ducheyne's Newton believes that dynamics and theology are contiguous endeavors, yoked together for the overarching task of moving from "the intermediate causes of things," or impressed forces, to the "more profound causes, until one arrives at the highest cause" (250). But that is a statement of mission, not of method. What is the method of theology, according to Newton? From Ducheyne, only a negative answer is forthcoming. He rejects, convincingly, Mamiani's case that Newton's regulae philosophandi and "rules for interpreting the words and language in Scripture" have a common origin. And he declares that there is a "fundamental epistemological difference" between the methods of physics and theology (269). In particular, Newton made clear that theology is no axiomatic-deductive science. Allegedly, it is "contrary to God's purpose that the truth of his religion should be as obvious and perspicuous to all men as a mathematical demonstration" (268).

There is much to appreciate in this book. Its contextualism shows exquisitely Newton's thought on method arising out of engagement with ideas on the nature of science in his age. Ducheyne offers a novel and fruitful account of Newton's concept of analysis and synthesis in physical theory. What is more, the author captures all the subtleties of Newton's sophisticated inductivism, and shows abundantly how and where it worked -- or failed. His account is both technically savvy and historically rich. Historians will delight in discovering the vast range of Newtonian manuscripts he surveys, and the stupendous swath of secondary sources he mobilizes. Further, Ducheyne adds a much-needed chronological dimension to his reading, as he shows that Newton's methodological views evolved significantly over time. For instance, one priceless nugget I picked from him is that the first time Newton proved centripetal forces to be necessary and sufficient for Kepler orbits was in the initial revision of his De Motu (229).

At the same time, as Ducheyne sheds much new light on Newton's method he leaves some corners in the dark. His account plausibly elucidates the gist of (causal) analysis and synthesis in Book III of the Principia, but what is Newton's method in Book I? Is it analysis and synthesis as meant by the mathematical tradition of his time? Something else? If so, how did Newton mean them? Regrettably, Ducheyne does not say. In response, he might say, fairly, that my question is about the method of discovery whereas his book is really about Newton's logic of confirmation. So, rather than elucidate the heuristics in Book I, Ducheyne puts the spotlight on its alleged products, viz. models. But here the light turns somewhat dim. Ducheyne seems uncertain about the exact nature of the theorizing in Book I, as his terminological indecision suggests: by turns, he calls it "strictly mathematical" (80, 107), "abstract quasi-physical" (81), "physico-mathematical" (105, 108), "abstract physico-mathematical" (159) and " (physico)-mathematical" (299). The reader wonders, which is it?

Further, the author contrasts the "physico-mathematical" Book I and the "physical" Book III, but the contrast is less transparent than he thinks. He claims that Book I deals in idealizations and denotationless models whereas Book III has models "with referential content" and "empirical content" (106, 108). But this merely transfers the obscurity instead of dispelling it. It invites the question of what a model is for Ducheyne -- since Newton does not use such terms himself. The semantic view understands models as representations; and some explicate models as (partial) descriptions of their target system.[3] Then it is a mystery how there could be models devoid of reference and empirical content, which Ducheyne claims to find in Book I. And 'idealization,' allegedly at work in the same Book I, is not univocal either. As Weisberg 2007 shows, it comes in three kinds, and so we may wonder, which kind did Newton practice?

Thus, Ducheyne's reach for the toolbox of analytic philosophy of science yields mixed results. The reader might have been better served had the author stayed relentlessly historical, an act for which he is superbly equipped. A more profitable approach would have been to explain -- by contextualizing properly -- what Newton and hiscontemporaries took to be the nature of the theorizing in Book I. How does it compare to its illustrious, acknowledged predecessors, viz. the theory of Day Three in Galileo's Discorsi and the one in Huygens' Horologium Oscillatorium? Hopefully, Ducheyne will deign to take up this question soon -- as well as another, vast question that his book irrepressibly prompts us to ask: what was the fate of Newton's methodology in the century that came after him?


Achinstein, P. 1968. Concepts of Science. A Philosophical Analysis. Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press.

Weisberg, M. 2007. "Three Kinds of Idealization." Journal of Philosophy, 104: 639-659.

[1] A great illustration of how to satisfy both requirements is Newton's solution of the (dual) Kepler problem in orbital dynamics. The direct problem asks, the orbit being given, to find the (law of) the force that produces it; this shows the force to be necessary for the motion. The inverse problem asks, the force being known, to find the (shape or the parametric equation of) the orbit it produces; this proves the force to be sufficient for the motion.

[2] Here is a sample, exempli gratia, culled from the Keynes manuscripts: "[Idolatry] makes a Church guilty of Apostasy from God as an Adulteress forsakes her husband. It makes her guilty of spiritual whoredom with other lovers." Quoted on p. 324; I have modernized Newton's spelling.

[3] E.g., Achinstein 1968: 209-12, a source with which Ducheyne is visibly familiar.