The Many Faces of Beauty

Placeholder book cover

Vittorio Hösle (ed.), The Many Faces of Beauty, University of Notre Dame Press, 2013, 500pp., $65.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780268011192.

Reviewed by Robert E. Wood, University of Dallas


This work contains the conference papers from the first of three conferences at the Notre Dame Institute for Advance Study under the direction of Vittorio Hösle. The conferences were focused on what were previously known as three transcendental properties of Being: Beauty, Truth, and Goodness, respectively. The current volume contains the papers from the 2010 conference. There must be something in the air: in 2011, Harvard developmental psychologist Howard Gardner came out with a book entitled Truth, Beauty, and Goodness Reframed. That work operated within the framework of the Kantian restriction to propositions, aesthetic awareness, and personal relations, respectively, and spoke of these properties, in an awkward sense, as "virtues." Hösle's volume is not so restricted nor so misinformed.

The choice of participants follows a decision to include as many disciplines as possible and from a variety of countries. Thus the participants were a mathematician, a physicist, two philosophers with degrees in biology and physics, respectively, an anthropologist, a psychologist, an historian of law, an economist, a philosopher, a professor of education, a professor of German and philosophy, a painter-sculptor-novelist-essayist, a professor of musical composition, an English professor, a film critic, and a theologian. In addition to the United States, they came from Denmark, Germany, and Russia. (Hösle lists Israel, Ireland, and Canada, as well. He must be referring to the origin of the family, not to current location.)

The work is divided into five parts: 1. Beauty in Mathematics and Nature (four essays), 2. Beauty in the Human Mind and in Society (four essays), 3. Historicity, Interculturality, and the Ugly as Challenges of Aesthetics (three essays), 4. Beauty in the Arts (four essays: on painting, music, literature, and film), and 5. Beauty and God (one essay). Hösle devotes 18 pages to an ample introductory summary of the argument of each of the 16 papers.

Over Plato's academy there was a sign: Do not enter here unless you know mathematics. Unless one is a student of mathematics, the reader might want not to begin, as I did not, with the first entry, for there is a good deal of exciting discussion in the papers that follow. The volume gets off to what I regard as an inauspicious start with American mathematician Robert Langlands's "Is There Beauty in Mathematical Theories?" (Part 1) (Langlands is a truly distinguished mathematician, having received no less than seven awards for his work.) After four pages of chatty introduction, Langlands launches into 49 pages replete with mathematical formulae that neither I nor, I think I can safely say, most of the audience could follow. I'm sure mathematicians will appreciate his piece. He adds 4 pages of likewise chatty notes where he does say a few things about beauty that is largely absent from the body of the text. In the notes he admits that he had not the courage to broach genuinely aesthetic questions, but that, if we viewed mathematical truth as God's own truth, we might interpret that as beauty. I am surprised that he didn't at least mention the property of elegance in the solution of mathematical problems. Whereas Rube Goldberg solutions are always possible, proofs with the shortest number of steps are preferable for none but aesthetic reasons.

Hösle's treatment of the paper in his Introduction does more than summarize: it situates it within a larger historical framework. His personal contribution, "The Historical Evolution of Aesthetic Theories" (Part 3), displays his penchant for an historical approach to philosophic problems. Hösle distinguishes seven stages in the history of art in which he attempts to show the distinction between mere oscillation and true progress. Five stages prepare for "the classical aesthetics" found in German Idealism. Oral discussion is postulated as a first stage that is taken up in the invention of writing, particularly in China and India. The works are mainly descriptive, usually deal with but one art form, and disregard as inferior the works in other cultures. Hösle claims that they tend to focus on moral and political issues, with less attention to metaphysical, epistemological, and semiotic issues. He must mean the various treatises, because Hindu, Buddhist, and Taoist art is clearly metaphysically preoccupied. The third stage is the Greek where professional philosophers Plato and Aristotle take up the issues. Medieval aesthetics is a fourth stage, drawing heavily upon the neo-Platonism of Plotinus and Pseudo-Dionysus and finding a significant place in Aquinas. Humanism and the Renaissance form a fifth stage with emphasis upon creativity and the separation of fine art from craft traditions. The enthusiasm for ancient art without ancient religion led to a detachment of art from religion. Around 1800, and as a sixth and classical stage, theoretical aesthetics became highly developed in Schiller, Schlegel, Hegel, and Schopenhauer, with Kant's Critique of Judgment as essential background. The seventh stage is the collapse of the Hegelian synthesis with the evaporation of the concept of Absolute Spirit and the rise of positivism with a focus on production and reception. With Adorno and Heidegger, the centrality of the artwork again takes on center stage. The essay concludes with an admonition not to stray too far from the aesthetics of German Idealism that combines "thorough interest in the concrete arts and their history with a metaphysics of beauty and a recognition of a normative dimension to art, which is connected in a complex way with human autonomy." (297)

The Hegelian tradition appears also in the first part of the book with German philosopher/physical theorist Dieter Wandschneider's "Beauty in Nature both in its Laws and its Entities" and German philosopher/biological theorist Christian Illies's "The Evolution of Autonomous Beauty: Sexual Selection versus Natural Selection" (both Part 1). Illies had teamed up with Hösle to edit a volume from the University of Notre Dame Press on Darwinism and Philosophy, to which Hösle contributed "Objective Idealism and Darwin." So Notre Dame exhibits here, and with the appointment of Hösle to organize the three events, a similar turn to Hegel that is found in "The Pittsburgh School," where McDowell and Brandom are beginning, they said, to catch up with Hegel. We are observing Heidegger's claim that great thinkers are all contemporaries. The rejection of Hegel, especially in the tradition flowing from Bertrand Russell and G. E. Moore, the logic of whose unfolding was traced ahead of time in the first sections of Hegel's 1807 Phenomenology, is now again being rejected: a negation of the negation.[1]

Wandschneider cites Hösle that "the good, the true, and the beautiful exist in themselves and were simply unfolded in reality by the mechanisms of evolution." He goes on to say that "Hegel's interpretation of the beautiful as the sensuous coming-into-appearance of the ideal has in no way been rendered obsolete" by developments in biology (120-21). He also cites Heisenberg's "in the beginning was symmetry," a theme taken up in American astrophysicist Mario Livio's on "Symmetry: From Perception to the Laws of Nature" (Part 1).

Illies stresses the developmental continuity but also essential difference between men and animals. In animals, aesthetic display (feathers, dances, love nests) is almost wholly centered upon mating. Like Livio, he also points to the attractiveness of symmetry in this function. But in the human case, "beauty becomes disconnected from reproduction." (160) He comments on a hierarchy of "Beauty's Way through Nature": accidental beauty in the environment, beauty as relational (bees attracted to flowers) and as involved in sexual selection, then in the human cultivation of taste, and finally, beauty for its own sake. Illies ends by citing a similar line of Hösle's on evolution's slow exhibition of the transcendentals.

Livio's exciting piece draws upon science, art, psychology, and mathematics. He begins with Rorschach inkblots and the symmetry of animals, then palindromes like "Able was I ere I saw Elba," which have their counterpart in Y chromosomes whose six out of 50 million DNA letters are also palindromes. By a happy chance, 11 of the capital letters of the alphabet can be vertically dissected to show mirror symmetry and 9 horizontally, indicating an unconscious preference for symmetry. Livio explores the various kinds of symmetry in mathematics. His most interesting exposition shows how mate selection, cognition, and predator avoidance individually and in combination indicate that "our minds are attracted to and are tuned to the detection of symmetry." (109)

That takes us through all the papers in Part One, on Mathematics and Nature. I find it interesting to compare Livio's comprehensive view of symmetry with one of the most interesting papers, the one by American philosopher-Germanist Mark Roche, "The Function of the Ugly in Enhancing the Expressivity of Art" (Part 4), on challenges to traditional aesthetics. (Underscoring the Hegelian vein, the editor informs us that the first to devote a whole book to the notion of the ugly was the Hegelian Johann Rosenkranz.)

Roche begins with an observation also made by Kant on the beautiful rendering of the ugly. (Kant exempts the disgusting, which, however, has infiltrated the "avant-garde" today.) In the case of "difficult beauty" (Bosanquet), one has to understand how "dissonance, tension, and seemingly heterogeneous parts, along with often repugnant subject matter, fit together to constitute an artwork." Great art involves the quality and relation of its content and form integrating part and whole, with "a window onto metaphysical meaning." "The beautiful, the sublime, and the ugly meet these criteria." (329)

In a retrospective, Roche notes that the artistic treatment of the ugly began with Roman satire and came front and center in the depiction of Christ's passion and the suffering of the martyrs. (Aristotle had already called comedy a species of the ugly.) In the emergence of modernity, the sublime, which involves dissonance, is gradually replaced by the ugly. The links with religion and morality are cut and "reality" becomes the focus in Art for Art's Sake. Adorno saw the ugly in art as emancipation from harmony, since beauty in fact covers over the ugliness of life. Originality becomes a prime criterion. And from that emerges both kitsch and quatch: ""whereas kitsch seeks to please, independently of any higher aspirations for art . . . quatsch seeks to shock or confound, independently of any higher aspirations for art." (340)

Roche distinguishes and examines four types of the ugly beautifully treated: repugnant beauty (Rodin's The Old Courtesan), beauty fractured in content (Picasso's Head of a Woman), "ischyric" beauty, fractured in form (Picasso's Guernica), and dialectical beauty as implicit critique of the ugly (Grosz's Pillars of Society). In the end, for Roche this modern focus may be "indicative of a higher logic and part of a higher story" that will include the ugly.

What I find particularly interesting is the stark contrast with Livio's observations on symmetry in nature and our own rootedness in nature. The new forms of art are not only emancipated from ethics and religion, they also involve emancipation from nature itself, in us and outside us.

Two other participants take up the theme of the ugly. Anthropologist Francesco Pellizzi's "'Beauty and the Beast'" (Part 2) contains what the author admits are "scattered observations" about archaic art that he supplements with scattered, extra-lengthy notes. Some of them tie in with Roche's observations: "As in the case of the Aztec goddess Coatlicue, or the Hindu goddess Kali, a frightening form manifests the dark roots of a generating/annihilating power that is itself beautiful or sublime." (182) This creates a precedent for modern fascination with "the horrid, the scary, and the excessive (sometimes called the sublime)." It also connects in ancient Greece with the legend of Medusa whose look turned men to stone, but whose severed head appeared at the center of Perseus's shield. (192)

Russian painter, sculptor, novelist, and essayist Maxim Kantor also follows the direction of Roche's treatment of the ugly in "Beauty under Trial by Modernity" (Part 4), on various artforms. Kantor deals primarily with painting. He hearkens back to the observations made by Livio on symmetry: "There was a time when beauty was a criterion of action and behavior, of public and political life, of human features and intellectual development. In a way, it was evidence of our belief in a harmoniously structured world." (361) But he observes that "Art has become brutal and sharp, furious and powerful -- and the more brutal it is, the more often we say that it is great art." He appeals to Botticelli's painting, La Calumnia, where naked beauty as truth is tried by ugly judges; he asks the readers to keep that in mind throughout the exposition. (361) It testifies to "the existence of a fragile image that opposes impersonal power." (384) He contrasts the image with its personal character from the symbol with its impersonal character. (359)

Kantor speaks like a prophet in presenting an exposition and attack upon the avant-garde in art. The avant-garde creates symbols instead of images. It begins with a protest and ends with serving the rich. Now art becomes decorative, chosen because it fits the décor of a room rather than for what it indicates. It goes back to the primitive and introduces chaos. Most of its practitioners hate God, though some, like Dali, do not. But Kantor also distinguishes those avant-garde figures who still seek truth and beauty and those who do not. And he holds out hope that just as Christianity assimilated pagan art in the past, so it might be able to do so with the new pagan art in the future (386).

Playing counterpoint to the Hegelian emphases in various papers, American educator Pradeep Dhillon, in "A Kantian Approach to Writing a Global Art History" (Part 2), concludes by calling for "a return to a history inspired by Kant and Wittgenstein rather than by Hegel." (323) That is a history without a progressivist view focused on the West but with a view of universal openness to the family resemblances involved in the art of all cultures. The former she finds in Clive Bell, R. G. Collingwood, and Arthur Danto. The Kantian distinction between formal properties and the content of "dependent beauty" are involved in all art insofar as the history and milieu of artworks determine both the form and the content. It is the form that grants family resemblances.

Playing counterpoint to all claims to objectivity in art, German economist Holger Bonus, in the shortest essay in the collection (8 pages),"The Function of Art in the Economy of Cultures" (Part 2), follows, in effect, Hume's "Of the Standard of Taste." It is the community of experts at any given time that supplies the factual standard in assessing artworks. He distinguishes search qualities that one looks for in artworks, experience qualities that emerge from dealing with the works, credence qualities that depend upon the reputation of the works, and cultural quality that is pronounced upon through the network relations among experts. Bonus cites the famous case of Man with the Golden Helmet, attributed to Rembrandt but later widely claimed to be the work of someone else, after which it lost its focal and thus monetary value. The work did not change; what did change was the value-claim and thus the market value granted it. Nonetheless, art "keeps the world moving. The artist creates new worlds and utilizes the huge potential of fiction." (271) Art gives expression to the values that move human beings.

Danish psychology professor Bjarne Sode Funch explores "The Beauty of Life in Art" (Part 2). He distinguishes five types of art appreciation: aesthetic contemplation, attending from a distance without consideration of meaning; cognitive art appreciation, attending in relation to some information; emotional art appreciation, giving priority to emotions over information; aesthetic fascination, focusing as if under compulsion upon one particular work; and aesthetic experience, transcending the other four types in an experience of wholeness. He explores the psychological conditions for such experiences by beginning with developmental psychology.

German law professor Peter Landau explores "The Law as Expressed in Art" (Part 2). He begins with the Stele of Hammurabi in which the God of the Sun dictates the law to the king. He discusses medieval collections of laws that were accompanied by images. In the German legal tradition, The Mirror of the Saxons is an illuminated manuscript. A twelfth century treatise on Roman law imagines Justice surrounded by six daughters; above her head is Reason, and on her lap is seated Equity. Landau reaches a bit when he sees the Madonna and Child surrounded by six angels with the Holy Spirit above her head "reminding" us of the figures in the treatise. Likewise, the depiction of marriage in several paintings becomes the occasion for speaking of marriage practices throughout the ages. He also discerns "a hidden relation" between Velasquez's Las Lanzas and Grotius's work on international law.

Part 4 deals with the arts. We have looked at Kantor on painting. There are three more arts covered: music, literature, and film. "Beauty in Music" is the contribution of German professor of composition Claus-Steffen Mahnkopf. He provides a detailed systematic chart that allows him to compress a great deal in just 11 pages. The chart has nine areas that operate at three parallel levels yielding 27 areas for examination.

Like Kantor, he notes that through the avant-garde of the nineteenth century, beauty was an empty shell of a word that only applied to a restricted era of art history or particular genres. However, Mahnkopf maintains two basic theses: 1. Music is beautiful in a most emphatic sense that calls for continual revisiting of musical pieces. It pervades all cultures through the ability to sing and dance. It affects the whole soul. It inhabits space and time. It is actualized in subjectivity. It underlies the conceptuality of language. It dissolves boundaries, evokes feelings of transcendence, and yet its pieces are interpreted differently through history. 2. Though beauty is the most elemental validity claim, its relevance diminishes in a wider framework.

Among many other things, he describes three types of listening: hedonistic, which is focused upon beauty, musical focused upon form, and aesthetic focused upon unique truth. He concludes by saying that, like no other art, it combines material, form, expression, concept, and spirit. "The beauty of music lies in its philosophical dignity, its exceptional mediality, its anthropological centrality, its metaphysical sublimity, its religious crypticism, and its disarming liveliness." (398)

American English professor and poet Mary Kinzie has a piece entitled, cryptically, "'The Air of These': Dimension and Gladness in Literary Art." The exposition begins and ends with a no less cryptic poem. The last poem ends with the title, where 'these' presumably means the words of the poem and 'air' refers to its atmosphere. 'Gladness' receives an etymological analysis centering upon gleaming and joy. 'Dimension' is used but not explained: "every experience of dawning utterance that builds to dimension in a poem is defined by an emotion of gladness." (404) She goes on to say that everything in a poem means twice: it means itself through its style and gains further meaning through "the layering of etymologies beneath the surface of the denotation" and through tropes. (404) I assume that layering adds the dimension to which she refers. In the body of the essay she describes a novel and three poems.

The contribution of American professor of film and literature Dudley Andrew is entitled "What Constitutes Beauty in Film?" It is centrally focused upon the films and writings on film and music of Eric Rohmer, who had earlier in his life been a novelist. Rohmer paid special attention to Mizoguchi and Murnau, whose Tabu (1930) he regarded as film's greatest masterpiece. He saw parallels between music and film, especially in the interplay of perspective, design, clarity and hierarchy with color, movement, and detail. He felt most at home in Kant and in his idea of the correspondence between mind and world beneath the world brought to language.

Andrew notes that beauty in film interplays with the picturesque and the sublime and that, since the 70's, "the dark and endless seas of the sublime . . . rule our era." (436) And, countering the Hegelian drift of several essays in this volume, he remarks that the shift that began with Romanticism was ignored by Hegel with his focus on beauty.

Finally, American professor of historical and systematic theology Cyril O'Regan brings the symposium to a close by examining "Theology, Art, and Beauty," with an historical account of how they have been related. He centers attention upon Dante's La Divina Commedia as the terminus of eschatological reflection beginning with Augustine and carrying on the Neo-Platonic tradition of Pseudo-Dionysius, where beauty is inducted into the ranks of the transcendentals. The Paradiso synthesizes the tradition from the Fathers to the Scholastics, reconciling Aquinas and Bonaventure.

In Luther, "his cross seems to deconstruct the beautiful" as he attacks neo-Platonism (and reason itself as "the whore of the devil.") (453) Calvin restores natural theology and beauty as the glory of God, a view carried on in one way by Milton and in another by Jonathan Edwards. Even in the development of Scholasticism in the line of Suarez, theology is separated from the arts and from beauty. O'Regan cites von Balthasar, who has traced this development: "theology without relation to the arts suffocates, and a theology without beauty cannot persuade." In post-Tridentine Catholicism, that relation is kept alive, not by the theologians but by artists.

The author claims that Enlightenment and Romanticism are united in their reduction of the authority of institutional Christianity and a focus on immanence. In the former, arts instruct and entertain. Romanticism questions the adequacy of Enlightenment's instrumental reason and recovers Neo-Platonism as a rival to Christianity. In the post-Romantic era, creativity and artifice take center stage, but there is also a new focus on the sublime. O'Regan closes with "the major intuition of the theological aesthetics of Balthasar" that parallels the observation of Roche and Kantor: today there is the opportunity for theology to embrace the avant-garde and move beyond the canons of medieval aesthetics. (462)

The Many Faces of Beauty provides stimulating approaches to the topic. We have a look at many different art forms and a look at beauty through history from many different perspectives. As we move into and through the twentieth century, there is a defocusing on beauty and a focus upon the sublime. Also, it is unusual to find reaction to Hegel, pro or con, appearing in several of the articles. But there is a new interest in Hegel today, especially in the circles that pronounced him dead. This work should pique that interest.

If the future publication of the successive symposia on Truth and Goodness are as insightful and comprehensive as this one on Beauty, they will be eminently worth reading.

[1] For a new approach to Hegel, see my Hegel’s Introduction to the System forthcoming from the University of Toronto Press.