The Meaning of the Wave Function: In Search of the Ontology of Quantum Mechanics

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Shan Gao, The Meaning of the Wave Function: In Search of the Ontology of Quantum Mechanics, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 189pp., $140, ISBN: 9781107124356.

Reviewed by Mario Hubert, University of Lausanne


What is the meaning of the wave-function? After almost 100 years since the inception of quantum mechanics, is it still possible to say something new on what the wave-function is supposed to be? Yes, it is. And Shan Gao managed to do so with his newest book. Here we learn what contemporary physicists and philosophers think about the wave-function; we learn about the de Broglie-Bohm theory, the GRW collapse theory, the gravity-induced collapse theory by Roger Penrose, and the famous PBR theorem; we learn about Schrödinger's original idea that the wave-function represents charge densities; we learn about the notorious measurement problem and its consequences; we learn about the challenges to find a consistent relativistic quantum theory; and we learn, of course, Gao's own suggestion for the status of the wave-function. Above all, Gao shows us the significance of protective measurements for our search of the ontology of quantum mechanics. Still not widely recognized among physicists and philosophers, protective measurements let us look deeper into quantum mechanics. For Gao this is the main tool to settle the issue on the ontological status of the wave-function: the wave-function is real because one can measure it.

Let's first clarify the meaning of "real" and the meaning of "measure". The meaning of "measure" is easily understood. The wave-function, Gao argues, can be measured by means of protective measurements. In quantum mechanics, there are (among many others) two distinguished classes of measurements: von Neumann measurements and weak measurements. When physicists measure an observable, they in general mean a von Neumann measurement, which projects the wave-function to a certain subspace in Hilbert space -- in standard parlance, this is the collapse of the wave-function. But apart from "collapsing" the wave-function, one can measure a system by letting the measurement apparatus interact with the system as weakly as possible, so weakly that the wave-function remains (almost) unchanged. Protective measurements are now a special class of weak measurements. The crux of protective measurements is that they yield the expectation value of an observable with just one measurement; the pointer of the apparatus moves to the value of the expectation value. The wave-function can be reconstructed from a series of protective measurements, which specify the probability density and the probability current -- in a similar way, the wave-function can be reconstructed from a series of weak measurements of its real and imaginary part as done by Lundeen et al. (2011). After Gao has explained very clearly the basics of protective measurements in the first chapter, they accompany us throughout the entire book.

In what sense the wave-function is real is harder to elucidate. Gao argues that the wave-function is better thought of as better not real in the sense of a nomological entity (chapter 3). The nomological view has been advocated within the de Broglie-Bohm pilot-wave theory in order to make sense of the wave-function being defined in configuration space. If the wave-function is time-independent, one is inclined to understand it rather as something law-like than as a physical field undulating in configuration space. In order to evaluate Gao's critique of the nomological interpretation, we need to understand the distinction between the universal wave-function and the effective wave-function. The universal wave-function is the wave-function that guides all the particles in the universe together. Under certain circumstances, though, one can assign a wave-function to a subsystem of the universe, a hydrogen atom for example. This wave-function is the effective wave-function of the subsystem, and it is indeed the wave-function familiar from the application of quantum mechanics.

Gao now attacks the nomological interpretation explaining that the effective wave-function has to encode the influences between particles inside and outside the system:

for the electron in the hydrogen atom, there are countably many real-valued wave functions corresponding to different energy eigenstates of the electron, but they may all describe a particle that is at rest in the same position at all times. Therefore, if the ontology of Bohm's theory consists only in particles and their positions, then the effective wave function of a subsystem must encode the influences of the particles that are not part of the subsystem. (p. 27)

According to Gao, it is a feature of the nomological interpretation that the effective wave-function encodes the non-local influences of the environment on the system (section 3.3). He refers to Esfeld et al., who write:

The non-local law of Bohmian mechanics allows us to encode the influence of those particles, which are not part of the subsystem but nevertheless have an effect on its evolution, in a single object: the effective wave-function, which is defined as a function on the subsystem's configuration space. (2014, p. 775)

This passage, however, precedes the authors' discussion of the ontological status of the wave-function. The physical effects of the effective wave-function are indeed totally independent of the interpretation of the wave-function. Irrespective of the interpretation of the wave-function, once a system has an effective wave-function, the system can be taken to be independent from the environment in the following sense: first, the guiding equation for the subsystem decouples from the equations of the environment, and second, the wave-function of the subsystem follows the Schrödinger equation. But the change of the effective wave-function is due to the changes in the environment. We recall that if the effective wave-function exists, it coincides (up to normalization) with the conditional wave-function defined by ψ(x,t):=Ψ(x,Y(t)), with Ψ the universal wave-function and Y(t) the configuration of the environment. Although we may mathematically describe the subsystem in utter ignorance of what is exactly happening in the environment, the non-local effects of the particles outside the system are always encoded in the effective wave-function.

Moreover, what Esfeld et al. emphasize in the above example of the hydrogen atom is not non-locality but rather the meaning of energy within the dispositional interpretation of the wave-function. This all started when Belot (2012, pp. 79-80) argued that if the wave-function represents the disposition of particles, the wave-function should uniquely determine the way particles move. The above example of the hydrogen atom -- Belot in fact used a particle in a potential well -- aims at showing that there are many different wave-functions leading to the same motion, namely a particle in rest, and so the dispositional view is untenable. Esfeld et al. (2014, pp. 785-6) replied that this example doesn't threaten the dispositional interpretation because the wave-function not only encodes the motion of the particle but also how the particle will interact with another system relative to the energy eigenstate of the effective wave-function.

Now that we know what the wave-function is not for Gao, let's discover what its ontological status actually is. In chapter 2, Gao introduces the ontological models framework, which provides the formal framework for his argument. This framework presupposes that the behavior of every quantum system is determined by an underlying (maybe hidden) ontic state λ and that the wave-function figures in the representation of this ontic state. The central question is now whether the wave-function is a unique representation of λ or whether different wave-functions can refer to the same ontic state λ. If there are many representations of the same ontic state, the wave-function is said to be ψ-epistemic.

There are two ways the wave-function can be ψ-epistemic. First, a quantum particle gets its wave-function relative to being a member of a certain ensemble. For example, an electron is said to be in a spin x-up state, if it belongs to an ensemble of electrons, which satisfy the spin x-up statistics. If an electron is in a spin y-up state this means that it belongs to a spin y-up ensemble. In this case, where the wave-function is merely a tool for the statistical outcomes of ensembles, it is called ψ-statistical. It may happen, though, that some particles in the x-up ensemble are in the same ontic state λ as some particles in the y-up ensemble. The statistical pattern of the ensembles doesn't rule that out. Second, the wave-function can just encode the state of belief of an agent. That is, whether an electron is assigned spin x-up or y-up is determined by the knowledge of the agent. So two agents may disagree on the state of the very same electron -- one agent may say x-up, the other may say y-up. In this case, the wave-function is said to be ψ-subjective. (Many thanks to Tim Maudlin for telling me about the distinction between ψ-statistical and ψ-subjective).

If the wave-function uniquely represents λ, it's indifferent to any epistemic state of an agent, and every particle in the above spin example belongs to a unique ensemble. Then the wave-function is said to be ψ-ontic. The famous PBR-theorem rules out the wave-function to be ψ-epistemic. In particular, the wave-function is neither ψ-statistical nor ψ-subjective. In other words, in all quantum theories the wave-function has to be ψ-ontic. Hence, the statistical interpretation of quantum mechanics given underlying ontic states is inconsistent with the predictions of quantum mechanics. And if the wave-function represents the state of belief of an agent about the ontic state, this also leads to a contradiction with measurement results.

Gao needs all this preparation because he will ultimately present his own ψ-ontic interpretation of quantum mechanics. But in order to reach the peak, there are some chapters left to be climbed.

In chapter 4, Gao extends the ontological models framework in two ways. The model should be suitable for deterministic quantum theories, as well as for protective measurements. It's true that within the ontological models framework, one always considers standard projective measurements. So it's reasonable to include protective measurements as well. It's incorrect, however, that the ontological framework model excludes deterministic theories. In the definition of the ontological models framework, the ontic state λ determines the probabilities of measurement outcomes k for a given measurement M, that is, p(k┃λ,M). Therefore, Gao seems to assume that this framework excludes deterministic theories. But the ontological models framework does not exclude deterministic quantum theories: If we set λ=(Q,ψ) in the de Broglie-Bohm theory, for example, where Q refers to the positions of particles, the probabilities are either 0 or 1. Similarly, Bell's theorem is valid for deterministic theories, even if his local causality condition may be formulated in terms of probabilities.

Having extended the ontological framework model, Gao presents a PBR-type theorem, whose proof is considerably shorter and simpler with the help of protective measurements. The original proof by PBR requires two wave-functions and four observables, while Gao requires two wave-functions but just one observable. The proof is as follows. Let's consider two spin states, x-up and y-up both happen to refer to the same ontic state λ, and an operator P projecting on the x-up state. After a protective measurement, the result of x-up protective measurement is 1 and the result of the y-up protective measurement is 1/2. Hence, the two results are incompatible with the common ontic state λ.

This discussion is followed by two chapters (5 and 6) that are more historical. Chapter 5 gives a very clear and illuminating novel derivation of Schrödinger's equation from symmetry principles in space-time. Chapter 6 examines Schrödinger's original idea that the wave-function represents charge densities.

These two chapters prepare the ground for the core of Gao's book: chapters 7 and 8. In them Gao introduces and defends his preferred quantum theory, in which the wave-function encodes random discontinuous motion (RDM) of point-like particles -- contrary to Nelson's stochastic mechanics (Nelson 2012), this theory makes the same empirical predictions as quantum mechanics. In essence, the RDM-theory is a re-incarnation of Bell's attempt to provide an ontology of local beables for Everett's quantum theory. Bell named it Everett (?) theory. Indeed, this theory is not a many-worlds theory; it rather resembles the de Broglie-Bohm theory without trajectories: particles jump discontinuously in three-dimensional space thereby fulfilling the quantum statistics. The new trajectories are actually just discrete points distributed in space, somehow similar to the GRW flash ontology. Due to this resemblance with the de Broglie-Bohm theory, Bell added a question mark to indicate whether his proposed ontology was still in the spirit of Everett.

Gao shows why in the RDM-theory the wave-function is ψ-ontic, how the measurement problem is solved, how the Born probabilities emerge, and how this theory differs from other stochastic theories, like Roger Penrose's gravity-induced collapse theory and the CSL theory.

In the final chapter, Gao explains what challenges need to be faced in combining quantum theory with special relativity and how the RDM-theory may be extended to a relativistic version. On the final pages, Gao briefly argues that one can retain a particle ontology even for quantum field theory and how the RDM-theory may provide a satisfying ontology.

All in all, this book provides novel arguments that the wave-function is a real physical object. Gao argues that the wave-function is not nomological, that it is ψ-ontic, and that it encodes the discontinuous jumps of particles. One could even go a step further by asking, "In what sense is the wave-function ψ-ontic?" Is it a physical field? Is it material stuff? Does it refer to properties? These are rather metaphysical questions, but it is exactly when considering the status of the wave-function that the border between physics and metaphysics gets blurry. And here metaphysicians may find a fruitful point of departure for their analysis.

Gao's book is particularly important for researchers in the foundations and metaphysics of quantum mechanics. Physicists and philosophers alike will find plenty of material for further development. The focus on protective measurements and on randomly jumping particles brings new input for unravelling the ontology of the wave-function -- and of relativistic quantum theories. Gao has shown us a promising path well worth following.


I wish to thank Dustin Lazarovici and Davide Romano for very helpful comments on previous drafts of this review. Special thanks go to Tim Maudlin for clarifying some misunderstandings regarding the PBR theorem.


Belot, G. (2012). Quantum states for primitive ontologists. European Journal for Philosophy of Science, 2(1):67-83.

Esfeld, M., Lazarovici, D., Hubert, M., and Dürr, D. (2014). The ontology of Bohmian mechanics. The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 65(4):773-96.

Lundeen, J. S., Sutherland, B., Patel, A., Stewart, C., and Bamber, C. (2011). Direct measurement of the quantum wavefunction. Nature, 474:188-91.

Nelson, E. (2012). Review of stochastic mechanics. Journal of Physics: Conference Series, 361(1):1-4.