The Mechanics of Meaning: Propositional Content and the Logical Space of Wittgenstein's Tractatus

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Hyder, David, The Mechanics of Meaning: Propositional Content and the Logical Space of Wittgenstein's Tractatus, Walter de Gruyter, 2002, 227pp, $88.40 (hbk), ISBN 3110172186.

Reviewed by Peter Hanks , University of Minnesota, Twin Cities


In The Mechanics of Meaning David Hyder develops two main interpretational strands in an effort to understand Wittgenstein’s theories of propositions and logical space in the Tractatus. In the first strand, Hyder argues that these theories arose out of an objection that Wittgenstein raised to Russell’s multiple-relation theory of judgment. In the second strand Hyder draws connections between neo-Kantian philosophy of science, in particular the work of Helmholtz and Hertz, and Wittgenstein’s notion of logical space. My remarks in this review will focus primarily on the first strand. Towards the end I will sum up the second.

In early May 1913 Russell began work on a long manuscript titled Theory of Knowledge.1 Despite a full load of lectures, students, meetings and visitors, by May 26 he had 240 pages and was optimistic about the book’s completion. Then on May 27 he had a visit from Wittgenstein.

Wittgenstein came to see me – we were both cross from the heat – I showed him a crucial part of what I have been writing. He said it was all wrong, not realizing the difficulties – that he had tried my view and knew it wouldn’t work. I couldn’t understand his objection – in fact he was very inarticulate – but I feel in my bones that he must be right, and that he has seen something I have missed. If I could see it too I shouldn’t mind, but as it is, it is worrying, and has rather destroyed the pleasure in my writing.2

Russell kept going, however, and by June 6 he had 350 pages — at which point he abandoned the manuscript. The immediate reasons for this had to do with problems with his account of inference. But it became clear to him as time passed that the fundamental problem had been raised by Wittgenstein.

All that has gone wrong with me lately comes from Wittgenstein’s attack on my work – I have only just realized this. It was very difficult to be honest about it, as it makes a large part of the book I meant to write impossible for years to come probably… . I must be much sunk – it is the first time in my life that I have failed in honesty over work.3

Looking back on this episode in 1916 he wrote to Lady Ottoline Morrell:

Do you remember that at the time when you were seeing Vittoz I wrote a lot of stuff about Theory of Knowledge, which Wittgenstein criticised with the greatest severity? His criticism, tho’ I don’t think you realised it at the time, was an event of first-rate importance in my life, and affected everything I have done since. I saw he was right, and I saw that I could not hope ever again to do fundamental work in philosophy.4

Wittgenstein’s criticism was directed at Russell’s multiple-relation theory of judgment, the centerpiece of the Theory of Knowledge manuscript. Glossing over a number of important details, we can say that Russell’s view was that judgment is a many-termed relation in which subjects are severally related to the constituents of propositions. For Russell, these constituents are objects, properties and relations. This theory was expressly designed to avoid an ontological commitment to propositions. Wittgenstein put his criticism in a June 1913 letter to Russell:

I can now express my objection to your theory of judgment exactly: I believe it is obvious that, from the proposition “A judges that (say) a is in a relation R to b”, if correctly analysed, the propositions “aRb.∨.~aRb” must follow directly without the use of any other premiss. This condition is not fulfilled by your theory.5

According to Hyder, understanding this objection is the key to understanding the theory of propositions and logical space in the Tractatus. The first question for Hyder, then, is what is Wittgenstein’s objection to Russell?

At least this much is clear: Wittgenstein’s objection turns on the fact that only some combinations of entities are judgeable. One can combine Desdemona, Cassio and the relation of loving in the judgment that Desdemona loves Cassio. But one cannot judge a combination consisting of, e.g., Desdemona, Cassio and Othello. The constituents of a judgment must be of the right number and variety of types (e.g. a property and an object, a two-place relation and two objects, etc.). Wittgenstein puts this by saying that from “A judges that a is in relation R to b” it must follow that “a Rb ∨ ~a Rb”, i.e. a necessary condition on a subject combining together some entities in judgment is that those entities can combine into a complex that either obtains or does not obtain. The problem appears to be that nothing in Russell’s multiple-relation theory rules out judgments of combinations that are not potential facts.

Russell could secure the implication demanded by Wittgenstein’s objection by adding what Hyder calls “riders” to the claim that A judges that a is in relation R to b. In this case, the riders would state that a and b are individuals and R is a relation. These are supposed to be the additional premises that Wittgenstein refers to in his letter. On Hyder’s reading of the objection the problem is that a dilemma arises for these riders – they turn out to be either “self-contradictory or redundant” (71). Unfortunately this crucial point does not come through in sharp focus. The confusion is compounded by the fact that immediately prior to presenting the objection as a dilemma Hyder says that the objection is that “the judgment-theory is viciously circular” (69).6 Let’s first consider the circularity interpretation and then return to Hyder’s dilemma. The circularity is supposed to stem from the fact that according to Russell’s theory of types, type distinctions are determined by what can or cannot be significantly judged. For example, one can judge that Desdemona loves Cassio, but one cannot meaningfully judge that love loves Cassio. This shows that Desdemona and the relation of loving belong to different types. The circularity arises, however, because the theory of judgment depends on the possibility of making type distinctions. In order to rule out impermissible combinations we have to place restrictions on the judgment relation that indicates the types of the entities being combined. So it appears that the theory of types is based on the theory of judgment and the theory of judgment is based on the theory of types.

If this were the problem then it would be difficult to see how it had such a profound impact on Russell. Type distinctions “depend” on what can or cannot be significantly judged only in an epistemological sense. We know that Desdemona and the relation of loving are of different types because we know that there are judgments in which Desdemona cannot be replaced by the relation of loving. But these facts about judgment do not make it the case that Desdemona and the relation of loving are of different types. For Russell, the type to which an entity belongs is an entirely objective matter that is ontologically independent of facts about judgment. If the circularity interpretation were correct, then all that Russell would have needed to say to avoid it is that type distinctions depend epistemically on facts about judgment and facts about judgment depend ontologically on type distinctions.

Returning to Hyder’s dilemma, consider the rider “a is an individual” – when added to the claim that “A judges that a is in relation R to b” this is supposed to be either self-contradictory or redundant. These are two horns of a dilemma that turn on whether the range of significance of the predicate “is an individual” includes both individuals and relations, on the one hand, or just individuals, on the other. (If relations are in the range of significance of “is an individual”, and R is a relation, then “R is an individual” is false. If relations are not in the range of significance of “is an individual” then “R is an individual” is meaningless.) Now if “is an individual” applies meaningfully to both individuals and relations then it cannot serve to pick out the type to which only individuals belong. (Recall that for Russell, a type is defined as the range of significance of a predicate.) Hyder claims that in this case “a is an individual” is “self-contradictory” – but the nature of the contradiction is obscure. Supposing that “is an individual” applies meaningfully to both individuals and relations and that a is an individual, the rider “a is an individual” is not only not self-contradictory, it’s true. The contradiction must be found somewhere else. Evidently the problem has to do with the fact that the purpose of the rider “a is an individual” is to state that a is of the type to which only individuals belong, but it cannot do this if the predicate “is an individual” defines a type that includes both individuals and relations – I believe this is the sense in which the rider is supposed to be “self-contradictory”. But the exact nature of the problem is obscure. Even if the range of significance of “is an individual” extends beyond individuals, why can’t the claim “a is an individual” say that a is of the type to which only individuals belong?

In any case, it is obvious that Russell would reject the idea that a predicate like “is an individual” could apply meaningfully to both individuals and relations. He makes this quite clear in his paper “The Theory of Logical Types”:

… not only is it impossible for a function Φ7

In other words, since “is an individual” and “R” are both significant for a, it follows that R is not significant for “is an individual”. This puts us on the other horn of Hyder’s dilemma, where the rider is supposed to be “redundant”. Once again, however, the problem does not come through clearly. Hyder writes: “If, on the other hand, we deny that the functions in question [e.g. the function expressed by “is an individual”] have a truth-value when they receive an argument of the wrong type, then they add nothing to the analysis, for they fail to exclude anything”(71). The rider “a is an individual” is added to “A judges that a is in relation R to b” in order to secure the implication to “a Rb ∨ ~a Rb”. Hyder’s point must be that the rider “adds nothing” to the claim that A judges that a is in relation R to b. But if so, then “A judges that a is in relation R to b” must already indicate that a is an individual (because of type-constraints implicitly imposed by the predicate “judges”), in which case the rider is wholly unnecessary. The “redundancy” here must be that the type-constraint expressed by the rider is already implicitly contained in the judgment relation. But if so, then the problem for Russell disappears, because it would follow directly from “A judges that a is in relation R to b” that a Rb or ~a Rb. If the predicate “judges” places type-constraints on the arguments it can take, so that, e.g., “A judges that Desdemona Cassio Othello” is meaningless, then the implication demanded by Wittgenstein’s objection is secured directly without the need for additional riders. It is hard to believe that Russell would not have realized this.

I strongly suspect that the whole notion of riders on claims about judgment is a red herring. This is partly because in a later and (presumably) more considered statement of the objection in the Tractatus Wittgenstein drops the mention of additional premises:

5.5422 The correct explanation of the form of the proposition “A judges p” must show that it is impossible to judge a nonsense. (Russell’s theory does not satisfy this condition.)8

5.5422 is a comment on and is immediately preceded by the following:

5.542 But it is clear that “A believes that p”, “A thinks p”, “A says p”, are of the form “ ’p’ says p”: and here we have no co-ordination of a fact and an object, but a co-ordination of facts by means of a co-ordination of their objects.
5.5421 This shows that there is no such thing as the soul – the subject, etc. – as it is conceived in contemporary superficial psychology.

Compare these remarks with something Russell wrote in 1919 about his reasons for rejecting the multiple-relation theory:

The theory of belief which I formerly advocated, namely, that it consisted in a multiple relation of the subject to the objects constituting the ’objective’, i.e., the fact that makes the belief true or false, is rendered impossible by the rejection of the subject. The constituents of belief cannot, when the subject is rejected, be the same as the constituents of its ’objective’.9

I think it is clear from these passages that the problem for Russell, at least as he later came to understand it, depends crucially on a rejection of the notion of a subject. I won’t try to explain this here. My point is that by focusing on riders to claims about judgment Hyder’s reading of Wittgenstein’s objection is off the mark.

The second main interpretational strand in Hyder’s book involves drawing connections between the neo-Kantian notion of a perceptual manifold and the Tractarian notion of logical space. The neo-Kantian notion of a perceptual manifold is a generalization of Kant’s notions of the a priori manifolds of space and time. The perceptual manifold of color, for example, provides a structured matrix within which any possible perception of color must occur. As Hyder explains, for the neo-Kantians, “all elements of human perception come structured in manifolds: colours, aural tones, sensations of hardness, warmth, etc. are all supposed to be organised in space-like structures” (19). This allows for the possibility of synthetic . priori knowledge of structural features of these manifolds, e.g. “Crimson is darker than pink”. The Tractarian notion of logical space can be viewed as the most general manifold: it is a space-like structure in which all possible human thought and language must be situated. According to Hyder, “on my reading, Wittgenstein’s theory is a radically modified form of Kant’s epistemology, in which logic takes the epistemological place of geometry and arithmetic” (157).

Hyder’s interpretive point is a measured one. He does not claim that Wittgenstein was influenced by neo-Kantian views in the development of his theory of logical space. Rather, the claim is that after this theory was in place Wittgenstein came to view it in an epistemological light because of the influence of Hertz and other neo-Kantians. The neo-Kantian influence apparently shows itself in remarks such as 5.61, “Logic fills the world: the limits of the world are also its limits”, and 5.632, “The subject does not belong to the world but it is a limit of the world.” Hyder’s Kantian reading of these very difficult remarks is intriguing.

Hyder’s book is a difficult one. I do not recommend it to those who are not already familiar with the early Wittgenstein. On the other hand, for those who are, Hyder offers a wealth of interesting interpretive proposals. (One point I have not touched on is a connection that Hyder draws between the objection to Russell’s theory of judgment and the regress of interpretations argument in the Philosophical Investigations.) Hyder also displays an impressive knowledge of both the English and German-language philosophical traditions. Although the book suffers from a lack of clarity in crucial places, I do think that those with a serious interest in the Tractatus will benefit from reading it.


1. Published posthumously as Theory of Knowledge: The 1913 Manuscript, vol.7 of The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, George Allen & Unwin, 1984.

2. Letter to Lady Ottoline Morrell, 27 May 1913. In Nicholas Griffin (ed.) The Selected Letters of Bertrand Russell, Routledge, 2002, 446.

3. Letter to Lady Ottoline Morrell, 19 June 1913. In Griffin 2002, 448.

4. In Russell’s Autobiography, Routledge, 1998, 282.

5. In Notebooks, 1914-1916, trans. G.E.M. Anscombe, Harper, 1961, 121. The emphasis is Wittgenstein’s.

6. The circularity interpretation is originally due to Stephen Somerville, “Wittgenstein to Russell (July 1913)”, in Language, Logic and Philosophy, Proceedings of the 4th International Wittgenstein Symposium, eds. R. Haller and W. Grassl, Hölder-Pichler-Tempsky, 1980, 182-188, and is endorsed by Nicholas Griffin in “Wittgenstein’s Criticism of Russell’s Theory of Judgment,” Russell 5, 1985/86, 132-145.

7. In Essays in Analysis, ed. D. Lackey, George Braziller, 1973, 229.

8. Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, trans. C.K. Ogden, Routledge, 1922.

9. “On Propositions: What They Are and How They Mean”, in Logic and Knowledge, ed. R.C. Marsh, Capricorn Books, 1956, 307. See also Russell’s introduction to the Tractatus, in the Ogden translation pp.19-21.