The Mental as Fundamental: New Perspectives on Panpsychism

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Michael Blamauer, The Mental as Fundamental: New Perspectives on Panpsychism, Ontos, 2011, 172pp., $93.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381146.

Reviewed by Sam Coleman, University of Hertfordshire


Panpsychism is hot stuff. Since Strawson's (2006) provocative argument (accompanied by a swathe of high-profile replies) that physicalism entails panpsychism, there have been papers aplenty and a big book (Skrbina's 2009 collection, Strawson featuring once more, as well as some contributors to the present volume). And now we have another book -- again a volume of essays (ten of them) by various fruitcakes (as a fellow panpsychist fruitcake I can say this). Most here propound panpsychism of some sort; two criticize it (Pierfrancesco Basile, Michael Blamauer), preferring dualism or idealism instead. By now panpsychists are not occupied with arguments for the view (for those see Strawson's 2006, and Nagel's groundbreaking 1979), but focus instead on elaborating and defending it against objections. The notorious 'combination problem' looms large here, consequently. I'll build my discussion around this problem, and we'll eventually head off into some philosophy of perception, and back around to the combination problem, circuit-wise.

Under conventional panpsychism all matter has some form of consciousness. One can put this by saying that all the ultimates -- matter's smallest components whatever those are -- have conscious experiences. Panpsychists disagree over whether there are experiencers intermediate between the ultimates and ourselves (for example our organs, brain-hemispheres, or neurons) and whether there are experiencers of a grander order -- a universe-mind for example. We'll get to these issues in due course, but for now I want to concentrate on the ultimates and ourselves, since the consciousness of these is panpsychist common ground. Now, the unique contribution panpsychism makes towards solving the hard problem -- that of explaining how, as materially-composed beings, we come to be phenomenally conscious -- is to impute consciousness to the material ingredients composing us. If the ultimates were not conscious, their assembly could not yield consciousness like ours, panpsychists maintain -- encouraged by zombies and imprisoned color scientists to think that 'mere' physical matter doesn't have what it takes for feeliness. For panpsychists it's just a question of assembling the little bits of consciousness appropriately, not one of generating sentience out of dead stuff, as physicalism seems to require.

So much for panpsychism's claimed explanatory virtue. It faces a big problem, however, in making sense of the combination of micro-experiencers (the ultimates) into macro-experiencers (us). As James (almost) said, you can bang ten people's heads together as hard as you like, you'll never get them to form a single group consciousness. What then accounts for the grouping of the ultimates into a single consciousness (assuming that's what we each have)? This is the combination problem.

Blamauer believes the combination problem rests on construing the ultimates as having two sides: mental and physical. If we shed this 'microdualism', say by going full-blown idealist (or Leibnizian), we would not have a combination problem, he maintains. I don't see this; but before explaining why, it would seem a good place for a note on panpsychic variations. What Blamauer is referring to is a panpsychist microdualism, on which all ultimates have irreducible physical as well as mental properties. So a given ultimate might instantiate mass, charge, spin and so on, alongside a separate phenomenal property. This, I believe, is Strawson's position. Another way of implementing panpsychism is more thoroughgoingly mentalistic, close, in fact, to idealism. On this view -- one might call it a 'pure panpsychism', I show here my preference -- the physical properties that ultimates have are strictly derivative upon their phenomenal properties. A way to think about this is to take the physical properties as purely structural -- physics describes a causal/relational web of entities, but remains silent about their intrinsic natures. Pure panpsychism slots phenomenality into this lacuna. The mass of an electron tells us something about how the electron will interact with other things -- but the thing that so interacts is intrinsically, and wholly, phenomenal in character. 'Mass' shows up just as a way of describing the interactive propensities of this phenomenal thing. Is this idealism? Not in this sense: physics can be a true theory on this view, plus there is nowhere a requirement that ultimates (or the dry goods they make up) only exist in so far as they are perceived. I think that pure panpsychism has a good claim to be considered a sensible form of physicalism (there's the tiniest of puns here).

Now to explain why I don't think the microdualism Blamauer bemoans is the cause of the combination problem. The real difficulty about combining the ultimates is that they are subjects of experience. That means they each have a point of view, and the spanner in the panpsychist works is that you cannot combine points of view. Consider what you are currently seeing, feeling, smelling and hearing (I leave aside what you may be tasting). Now imagine four subjects, each enjoying only the contents of one of your modalities: one's conscious experience is wholly taken up by what you see, the second's consciousness by what you feel, and so on. One might imagine that we could combine these four consciousnesses into one, and that the resultant combined subject would have a consciousness type-identical to yours (in respect of these elements of your consciousness). Perhaps the contents of consciousness can be combined in this way. But what cannot be combined is subjecthood. These four subjects had four different takes on the world, four different points of view, even if each point of view was filled up with a portion of your conscious experience.

When the contents of the consciousnesses of the four are integrated, and one subject is left to enjoy them, we have to ask where at least three points of view have gone. Either one subject survived and absorbed the experiences of the rest, or none survived but a fifth was spawned. But neither of these possibilities represents the integration of points of view, not in the way we can understand the integration of the contents of consciousness. Either way, some subjects have simply bitten the dust; they have not been integrated. What if all survived somehow in the whole? We would still not have one unified subject, but four or five distinct subjects -- each with its point of view. There might exist a subject who experiences in one go what the others experience serially, but that would not make its point of view the sum of their points of view. Points of view are essentially discrete.

So I can't see what difference it makes whether the ultimates have an irreducibly physical side or not. As long as they're subjects -- mini-minds, in effect -- combination will be off-limits. I don't think Leibnizian 'dominant monads' do anything to turn aside this difficulty. These are emergent items, not combined consciousnesses; and the panpsychist must eschew emergentism, as I argue below. Freya Matthews, who defends a cosmological panpsychism on which we are constituents of an ontologically fundamental universe-mind, has a brave stab at the combination problem. She suggests that the relation the universe-mind bears to us (and so the relation we perhaps bear to the psyches composing us, on pluralistic panpsychism) is explicable via Jungian 'autonomous complexes' -- self-standing chunks of our unconscious mind that are themselves unaware of the whole they are parts of. However, it's hard to see how this inventive suggestion is going to work out. Given her universe-mind as monistic starting point, Matthews' difficulty is how we come to be apparently autonomous subjectivities split off from it (a reverse combination problem). Now, either the Jungian complexes are subjects in their own right or they are not. If they are, Matthews seems to have helped herself to the explanandum -- we are not told how subjects could exist within a larger subject that encompasses them, only presented with a model (our relation to the autonomous complexes) every bit as troubling as the one she aims to make sense of. On the other hand, if the complexes are not subjects, then the analogy breaks down: for we decidedly are subjects. Perhaps our minds could be composed of mental chunks that fall short of being subjects (this is in effect the view I recommend -- on which more later), but this won't help explain how we compose the universe-mind.

Unless, that is, we are not really the absolute subjects we seem (to ourselves . . . ?) to be. There are hints that this is Matthews' real solution, as she says once or twice that what we have is only 'relative subjectivity'. This surely amounts to defeat. We started out trying to give an account of human subjectivity. If this gets retired for the sake of a grand universal consciousness, I think most would sooner do without the grandeur and keep what they know as most immediately real. Anyhow, James uncloaked the fatal difficulty for this sort of monism: the universe-mind comprises all our consciousnesses -- it knows all of us even as we do not know each other. But our mutual ignorance is not just a lack; it also adds to our thoughts. I wonder what you are thinking, I doubt whether you agree with me, I worry we won't come to consensus. The universe-mind must have these thoughts of mine. But it cannot have them sincerely, since it knows perfectly well what you think. Yet I certainly have them sincerely. Therefore it does not have my consciousness as I have it, as against the hypothesis.

This reductio proceeds from the assumption that our consciousnesses compose the universal consciousness, so that its consciousness is (in some sense) the blend of our own. This mereological principle is not something panpsychists can profitably reject -- for that would mean a universe-consciousness that stood apart from 'smaller' ones like ours. But this is not a model of combination. To return to the relation between ourselves and the ultimate-minds: if our minds stood apart from theirs in likewise fashion, and were somehow spawned by a magical law applying to a specific (but otherwise arbitrary) arrangement of ultimates, this would amount to the emergence of a human mind. Yet if the panpsychist finds herself embracing emergentism at this juncture, it is hard to see why she fought shy of allowing that consciousness simply emerges from the physical. The positing of subjects of experience that compose us, in short, is in strong tension with the anti-emergentist motivations of panpsychism.

David Skrbina also has a crack at combination, but his answer is reminiscent of Strawson at his most blusterous, whereby he suggests that combination of ultimate-subjects simply must happen somehow, since here we are with the datum in question, a unified mind. Personally I sympathise with Blamauer's conclusion, namely, that a shift away from panpsychism may be needed in light of the combination problem; that is, as long as panpsychism is committed to micro-subjects that compose our minds. What is perhaps called for is to postulate mental units that fall short of being subjects -- something like Jamesian 'pure experiences', or Russellian sense-data.

Philip Goff, however, defends an emergentist response to the combination problem. This, along with Godehard Brüntrup's contribution (an examination of the relation of panpsychism to structural realism), is the collection's high point: typically clean and clear, typically combative and controversial. Only the 'reductive panpsychist', says Goff, has a problem over combination -- this panpsychist holds that the truth about the composite mind is wholly fixed by truths about the minds composing it. Consider the (alleged) entity 'Bill's party'. Truths about Bill's party -- Goff claims -- are made true exclusively by truths about the party's constituents, namely, people, music, alcohol etc. For instance, if the party is rocking, this is a matter of people dancing, music pumping and (likely) alcohol being consumed. Given these facts there is no further contribution that Bill's party makes as such to the truth that 'Bill's party is rocking'. Bill's party is redundant as regards the truths that concern it: its existence follows from these truths rather than grounding them. In this sense it is, in Goff's terminology, a mere 'lightweight' entity. Panpsychists, according to Goff, are committed to taking human consciousnesses to be 'heavyweight' items, genuine features on the metaphysical landscape, as opposed to linguistic shadows like Bill's party. A sign of heavyweight status is genuine resemblance relations between entities -- for example, it seems plausible that Bill and Ben's consciousnesses at a time can genuinely resemble, just as could the conscious states of their respective ultimates. In contrast, if Bill and Ben's parties are both rocking, this is not a matter of resemblance between the parties as such, but concerns only resemblances between their respective components -- the dancers, drinkers and music. Thus, since Bill and Ben's consciousnesses can genuinely resemble (both can experience hunger, say), they are heavyweight items, truths concerning which are not simply a matter of truths concerning their constituents. Hence, reasons Goff, panpsychists are committed to subjects like us as emergent.

In the next part of the argument Goff explains why only the reductive panpsychist faces a combination problem. Our inability to make sense of the construction of a human subject by ultimate-subjects comes only so long as we essay a model on which the sole truths about the composite subject are truths concerning its components. As we found earlier, no such facts will suffice for the obtaining of a unified macro-consciousness. The emergentist panpsychist faces no similar difficulty, however, since he can simply hold that the macro-consciousness arises from the ultimates 'as a matter of brute fact or natural law' (136). Thus, not only must panpsychists be emergentists, says Goff, but they should be too, since this avoids the combination problem.

Goff's argument is ingenious, but I worry about both sides of it. On the claim that panpsychists must be emergentists: The heavyweight/lightweight distinction swiftly converts anyone who believes in the reality (heavyweight-ness) of (say) tables into an emergentist. If we say there are truths that the table itself makes true, Goff labels us emergentists, since we do not reduce the table to its parts. But almost no one reduces tables to their parts. And almost none of those who decline to so reduce tables consider themselves to be emergentists about tables. I take it a natural view, albeit one facing certain as-yet unresolved complications, is that not only is the table heavyweight, but all that's true of it at a time is made true by the parts it then has. The difficulty with Goff's argument for panpsychist emergentism is that it spawns all-too-much emergentism. One wants to be able to say that dry goods really exist, but not at the cost of emerging from their parts. There's nothing spooky about tables, surely. Similarly, a panpsychist (well this panpsychist anyway) will want to say that human consciousnesses are heavyweight, but also that they do not emerge from the ultimates. Goff has more work to do to convince me that if we can reductively explain the properties of some whole in terms of its parts, then the whole is effectively eliminated. Why not a view whereby wholes constrain their parts just as parts constrain their wholes?[1]

This brings me to the second side of Goff's argument, and to develop a point made earlier. If the panpsychist has to turn emergentist to keep micro-subjects in the loop, then it's hard to see on what basis she initially rejected physicalism -- which to panpsychists is a form of emergentism (since the connection between matter and consciousness appears brute for it). This is like someone who is vegetarian on moral grounds for her starter, and afterwards happily tucks into a steak. My diagnosis of the situation is somewhat different: As far as I can see what's causing all the trouble is the assertion that the ultimates are subjects. As long as subjects like us are composed of mini-subjects, emergentism is going to be the only option; Goff is right there (and ditto for cosmo-minds like Matthews'). The answer is not to embrace emergentism -- this is actually to abandon panpsychism as a coherent position. What really needs doing is to develop a conception of mental units that can compose a subject but which are not themselves subjects.[2] I'll come at this view -- a form of neutral monism -- via consideration of Riccardo Manzotti's paper on perception.

Manzotti wants to extend consciousness into the environment, on the grounds that this is the only way to capture the nature of perceptual experience. He opens with a stock anti-physicalist maneuver, rejecting the suggestion that 'certain neural patterns are by their very nature phenomenal' (84), and rails against the neuralist internalism of brain theorists. Manzotti's proposal is that when one consciously perceives a flamingo, say, one's consciousness 'spreads' beyond the head and includes the flamingo. This is not the direct realist view that the flamingo is a constituent of one's experience. I think the relevant difference is that the flamingo doesn't 'enter into' the experience, as on conventional direct realism, but for Manzotti the conscious mind expands outside the head and envelops the perceptual object. How does this relate to panpsychism? I'm not completely sure, though consciousness will be far more widespread than normally held if Manzotti's general account is correct -- every conscious experience with an object stretches out to envelop that object. Be that as it may, the theory recommends itself, Manzotti says, because it captures the sense that consciousness is world-involving, and it offers a simple answer to the problem of intentionality: your conscious state has the intentional object it does because that object is inside the conscious state. In the case of perception, the object perceived is the cause of your experience of it.

I confess to misgivings concerning the theory's supposed virtues. Why is neural machinery judged an inappropriate home for phenomenal properties? Manzotti does not say exactly, though his feeling seems to have to do with That Old Chestnut: apparent differences between physical and phenomenal properties. But if this is the basis, it's hard to see why extending consciousness beyond the brain will provide a more acceptable vehicle for phenomenality: external objects are ultimately composed of parts every bit as mundanely physical as the brain (prior to embracing panpsychism). Moreover, I can't see how the problem of intentional objects has been solved. If I understand, the perceptual object is the cause of your experience of it and gets to be enveloped in the experience itself as a result. But there are notoriously many causes of a perceptual experience, including everything that occurs behind the face but before the experience, and much of what's on the other side of the perceptual object, going all the way to the big bang. Why is it that I don't see the big bang when I see the flamingo, or the flamingo's parents flirtatiously pecking one another, both causes of my present experience? The answer that my experience envelops the flamingo begs the question: why, one wants to know, does my experience envelop just this far, and no further?

I spy a better view. Manzotti starts from the oft-alleged incommensurability between neural tissue and phenomenality. But another theory of perception, Russell's causal theory, diagnoses this sort of reasoning as mistaken from the outset. Panpsychists are familiar with the idea that physical science only has access to the extrinsic 'outside' of an ultimate -- to the effects it has on instruments and the relations it stands in with other entities likewise comprehended. Against this backdrop -- science as a merely structural characterization of the world -- panpsychists speculate that the intrinsic natures of ultimates involve phenomenal qualities. Thus the mind/body problem is ameliorated and physics is given an ontological heart by means of a single posit. Therein lies the parsimonious theoretical power of panpsychism, emphasized too by Brüntrup in his argument against a pure structural realism.

Russell, though, says much the same about the brain -- from without, as an observer, all one can get hold of are the effects of another brain on one's own consciousness (that's why the neuroscientist observing another man's brain really observes his own). Its intrinsic nature is totally inaccessible from outside. Thus, someone who infers, as so many have done, that brains are inappropriate vessels for phenomenality errs in taking it that she has ever accessed a naked brain, a brain as it is in itself. The only brain with which she has had that intimate relationship is her own. As regards the brains of others -- as regards our neuroscientific grip of them -- we have only an extrinsic characterization. No wonder there appears a shortfall between the neural and the phenomenal -- the neural is to the phenomenal, on this understanding, as a flimsy night garment is to the luscious body underneath. One can discover the contours, but not the substance. Thus, if we make the Russellian move there is no need to extend consciousness beyond the head in order to accommodate it in the material world, even if that maneuver held some promise of assisting in this cause (which I cannot see that it does).

Russell takes the view that the brain is a material object like any other, and here we have (in introspection) a window into the intrinsic nature of some matter. There is no reason, then, to consider that other matter outside the head is very much different in its inner character. If we did stretch to that consideration, we would neatly construct ourselves a mind/body problem (historical diagnosis). However, Russell's theory -- which Brüntrup seems to consider an open possibility -- need not result in the little-subjects-everywhere version of panpsychism. One might hypothesize that the sorts of qualities we apprehend in consciousness (colours and suchlike) are made conscious by some relational activity supported in the complex feedback mechanisms of brains (say, higher-order representation). Perhaps outside the head all that exist are variegated quality instantiations, with causal/relational profiles as we receive them from physics.

Without micro-subjects everywhere, there seems no unavoidable reason why we will run into a combination problem. Basile finds this Russellian avenue foreclosed by the thesis that experiences cannot exist without an experiencer -- which suffices to put ubiquitous micro-subjects back in the frame, and the combination problem, with its threat of emergentism, thereby re-surfaces. I accept this thesis, that experiences require subjects. But what the Russellian posits are less than experiences. The option overlooked in this collection, though it also puts mentality -- in a sense -- into the ontological fundamentals, is that phenomenal qualities can be split up: into qualities, which perhaps exist throughout micro-ontology as the panpsychist envisages, and that which makes these phenomenal, i.e., conscious to us. This latter is likely to be a relational matter. The options, then, appear to be emergentism of some form (whether it be physicalism, emergentism proper, or panpsychist emergentism) or a Russellian compote of realism about qualities, topped with a little light deflationism about consciousness. Overall, The Mental as Fundamental is a mixed bag, much as one would expect of any newly (re)born field of research, where rampant innovation gives a certain roughness to proceedings. But for devotees of panpsychism, as well as those intrigued by an idea steadily gaining in relevance, this is a book worth having.


Hüttemann, A. (2003) What's Wrong with Microphysicalism? (London: Routledge).

Nagel, T. (1979) 'Panpsychism,' in his Mortal Questions (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).

Skrbina, D. (2009) Mind that Abides: Panpsychism in the New Millennium (Amsterdam: John Benjamins).

Strawson, G. (2006) Consciousness and its Place in Nature: Does Physicalism Entail Panpsychism? (Exeter: Imprint Academic).

[1] See, e.g., Hüttemann 2003 for a view of this sort.

[2] Nagel: 'Presumably the components out of which a point of view is constructed would not themselves have to have points of view.' (1979:194).