The Messages We Send: Social Signals and Storytelling

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G. R. F. Ferrari, The Messages We Send: Social Signals and Storytelling, Oxford University Press, 2017, 190pp., $35.00, IBSN 9780198798422.

Reviewed by Paisley Livingston, Uppsala University and the University of Copenhagen


Ferrari develops a Gricean approach to understanding the various kinds of covert signalling he calls 'intimation'. He finds intimation prevalent in everyday life and deems it fundamental to the representational arts. In a first, brief theoretical chapter, he identifies some of his assumptions about intimation. Chapter 2 is devoted to the meanings conveyed by clothes. Ferrari engages critically and persuasively with the sociological and semiotic literature on the topic. In chapters 3 and 4 Ferrari identifies storytelling and lyric as instances of two different kinds of intimation. The final chapter briefly suggests ways in which the intimative model of storytelling sheds light on situational irony.

Ferrari identifies three kinds of intimation, starting with "intimation in quarter-on position." An example is found in Castiglione's description of la sprezzatura, "the art that conceals art." A courtier strives hard to convince some audience that he can effortlessly achieve something difficult. Were the courtier's intention to be recognized by the audience, the attempt at sprezzatura would collapse into affectation, so the intention is intentionally concealed. Ferrari informatively explores many other examples.

Ferrari's second kind of intimation, dubbed the "half-on" position on the "communicative scale," is what happens when someone acts on the intention to convey some message, but has neither the intention to get that intention recognized nor the intention to conceal it. To borrow an example from Grice: indifferent to the recognition of his intentions, King Herod has the Baptist's head brought out on a platter.[1] He intends thereby to get his audience to believe that the Baptist has been decapitated, but he does not intend to have this goal be realized by means of a recognition of his intention. While the orthodox Gricean would say that Herod did not non-naturally mean anything in this manner, Ferrari says that Herod intimates something.

To illustrate his third kind of intimation -- the "three-quarters-on position," Ferrari introduces an imaginary example: Nero is in love with Blanka and wants her to know it, but he does not want to make an overt declaration. He writes a diary entry in which he unambiguously expresses his love for her. He then intentionally leaves his diary where she is likely to discover it. Ferrari describes Nero's further intentions as follows:

Nero actively desired to have Blanka notice that he had left his diary behind on purpose and that his act was directed at her. He was not in the least indifferent about this outcome. At a second remove, however, Nero wanted to cover his tracks. He wanted Blanka to think he had meant the whole thing to seem accidental to her and that he acted in this way in order to spare himself and her the risks of an open gesture. That is, Nero wanted Blanka not to notice that he in fact intended her to see through the apparent accident all along. (116)

Ferrari explains that "Although Nero does not communicate his love to Blanka, he does not simply intimate it either. He does intimate his love to her, but not simply. His is an intimation of a convoluted sort, in which the overt and the covert are particularly intertwined" (68, my italics).

Ferrari reports that the example was inspired by an objection that Peter Strawson raised to Grice's proposed analysis of communication (133).[2] The example is inventive, but what is far more innovative is what Ferrari tries to do with it. He claims that storytelling in general belongs to the particular category of intimative signalling, illustrated by the imagined case of Nero and Blanka. Lyric poetry belongs to the "half-on" position described above.

These are empirical claims, and sweeping ones. Just think about the quantity and variety of the psychological and other events involved in the long history of storytelling and lyric poetry! Is it true that lyric poets never have any intentions with regard to the recognition of their semantic intentions? How was that established?

The claim about storytelling is not only sweeping, but puzzling. What, one wonders, is the essential intention that all storytellers supposedly have in common with Ferrari's sneaky suitor? To make good on this claim, Ferrari needs to give us a reasonably precise answer to that question, as well as sufficient reason to believe that such an intention is necessary to, or at least strongly correlated with. storytelling. By this reader's lights, Ferrari fails on both counts.

Ferrari says various things about the kind of intention on which all storytellers and Nero supposedly act. He says that Nero and the storyteller both engage in a pretence meant to be seen through; but one that is "sufficiently convincing to be seen as if it were not so designed" (161, 133). It is not clear what Ferrari means by 'pretence'. He calls pretence a "primitive" concept, so there is no explication on offer (140). At one point, we get: "The members of the audience know, of course, that what is being presented to them or described to them is a pretence -- an invention" (77). Another clue regarding Ferrari's understanding of pretence reads: "in short, there is a movie running in the novelist's head. That is where the pretence lies. The novelist does not pretend to tell things as they are; he describes and mimics a pretence, the movie running in his head -- describes and mimics it for real" (147). This remark presupposes that the novelist has thoughts about the story events in the movie or play which he or she will mimic in telling a story, and since that play or movie does not exist (and if it did, would itself have to be the product of pretence), we are back at the first step, that is, the stage where someone wants to tell a fictional story and so needs to imagine something, i.e. whatever content is to going to be imagined as true in the fiction. Yet Ferrari rejects the idea that fictionality can be explicated in terms of imagining or make-believe.

Here is another one of Ferrari's attempts to identify a "structural equivalence" between the intentions of both Nero and the storyteller:

The storyteller . . . does not communicate outright with his audience. But nor does he intimate in the manner of those who occupy the half-on position, for they are indifferent to having their intention noticed and he is not. His action aims more directly than theirs on getting his intention recognized, but less directly than does the communicator's. He wants the dramatically engaged audience to feel he is using the story to get something of his across to them (namely, his understanding of his own story), yet not cease to be dramatically engaged. (117)

The thought here would seem to be that different kinds of signalling can be identified in terms of the extent to which they "directly" aim at the recognition of intention. As Ferrari does not say what it means to aim directly at recognition, this attempt at identifying the key intention founders. Ferrari declares explicitly that the "distinction between the three positions of the communicative scale is not a matter of degree" (55), so either the storyteller has or does not have a sneaky intention of the same kind as Nero's.

Given Ferrari's descriptions of the example, it strikes me that Nero's relevant intentions should be reconstructed as follows:

In writing the diary entry and leaving it where Blanka is likely to find it, Nero acts on the following intentions:

(1) to have Blanka read the diary entry and come to believe that he loves her;

(2) to have Blanka falsely believe he was trying to trick her into thinking that he left the diary unintentionally;

(3) to have Blanka correctly believe that he left the diary intentionally and so have her falsely believe that she has seen through his attempt to trick her;

(4) to conceal intention (3) and thereby deceive Blanka in this regard.

What are the essential storytelling intentions that correspond to (2)-(4)? I cannot find a cogent response to that question in Ferrari's reflections on the topic. Deceptive nonfictional storytelling is of course prevalent, but that is not Ferrari's point. He refers mostly to literary storytelling, works of fiction. Must fictioneers act on a sneaky intention? Various philosophers have proposed that the constitutive intention upon which the author of a work of fiction must act is that of inviting some audience to engage in imagining based on some text, display, or other vehicle. That intention need not be sneaky or deceptive. As Margaret Macdonald put it, the "artistic plausibility" of a well-told story may inspire a feeling of "conviction," but not belief.[3] So getting the members of the audience to believe that the author has unsuccessfully tried to deceive them is not an intention constitutive of storytelling (which is not to say that storytellers are never manipulative). In contrast, Nero's getting Blanka to believe falsely that he has unsuccessfully tried to deceive her about his action in leaving the diary behind is essential to his strategy. This was, we should remember, meant to be an instance of the kind of sneaky intention that foiled the initial Gricean analysis of speaker's occasion meaning and motivated the protracted search for sufficency conditions on communicative intention.

Ferrari relies throughout on a contrast beween intimation and communication. Given that, it is fair to ask how he understands communication, and how storytelling essentially falls short of communicating. Ferrari does not devote many pages to the analysis of communication. He declares:

Full-blown communication has the recursive, self-embedded structure of a box within a box. When I communicate with you, I don't just 'want you to know', I 'want you to know that I want you to know'. Communicators succeed in what they are trying to do just by getting their audience to recognize what they are trying to do. (2-3, my italics)

These quick remarks about communication are problematic, even for Griceans. Requiring that the communicator intend that the recognition of the intention be the only condition on success raises the bar too high. Griceans routinely avoid this by proposing instead that what must be intended is that recognition of the intention be at least part of the reason for the target response's realization.

Ferrari's passing remark that the communicative intention has a "self-embedded structure" is also problematic and could mean several different things. Does he want to defend the idea that every communicative intention literally embeds itself as a whole?[4] Or does he want to endorse the thesis that these intentions are self-referential in some other sense?[5] If the idea is simply that there must be a second-order intention referring to a first-order one (as in Ferrari's "I want you to know that I want you to know"), there is the problem of possible higher-order sneaky intentions. Grice, we recall, reasoned that if the model of communicative intention required an "unrealizable" infinity of intentions, it would follow that no one every communicates intentionally, "strictly speaking." [6] Yet in the same context he also evoked the more promising strategy of requiring that certain kinds of sneaky intentions be absent from any intention that could, when acted on successfully, generate an utterance having non-natural meaning. Ferrari abruptly concludes his discussion of the nature of communication with the following potted summary of this long and thorny debate: "In response to Strawson's challenge, subsequent theorists have seen that communication, to be communication, must be overt, and have analysed this overtness as a kind of mutual awareness. The awareness comes at different technical strengths, depending on the theorist" (133).

To sum up, the series of analogies and disanalogies Ferrari draws out in his reflections on storytelling and the case of Nero and Blanka offer no sound basis for a general theory of storytelling. Philosophers who are familiar with the Gricean literature should agree that the complexity and subtlety of the issues raised by Grice's claims about semantic intentions, communication, and non-natural meaning demand a level of precision that is very difficult to achieve without recourse to detailed conceptual analysis and a painstaking (and at times technical) explication of terms and conditions. This reader must report that he found Ferrari's theorizing about communication, intimation, and the representational arts frustratingly imprecise. However, other parts of the book, and especially the discussion of clothing and various literary examples, are both informative and thought-provoking.

[1] Paul Grice, "Utterer's Meaning and Intentions," in Studies in the Way of Words (Harvard University Press, 1989), 86-116, at 109.

[2] P. F. Strawson, "Intention and Convention in Speech Acts," Philosophical Review 73:4 (1964): 439-460, at 446-447.

[3] Margaret Macdonald, "The Language of Fiction," Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volume 28 (1954): 165-184, at 182-183.

[4] Wayne A. Davis, Meaning, Expression, and Thought (Cambridge University Press, 2003), 88.

[5] Mitchell S. Green, Self-Expression (Oxford University Press, 2007), 63-69.

[6] Paul Grice, "Meaning Revisited," in Studies in the Way of Words, 283-303, at 302-303.