The Metaphysics and Ethics of Death: New Essays

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James Stacey Taylor (ed.), The Metaphysics and Ethics of Death: New Essays, Oxford University Press, 2013, 271pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199751136.

Reviewed by Donald Marquis, University of Kansas


This is a collection of original essays on issues that emerge from reflection on the metaphysics of death. The issue with which it primarily is concerned develops out of a famous argument due to Epicurus. Here is an updated version of it: Before one dies one is not yet harmed by one's death, and after one dies one does not exist to be harmed. Therefore, there is no time at which one is harmed by his death. It follows that no one is harmed by his death. This argument seems obviously sound.

Nevertheless, many ordinary people believe that their deaths (at least their premature deaths) are the greatest harms that could befall them. Most philosophers (at least those who are not thinking of Epicurus at the time) believe that also. Premature death deprives us of all of the life we would have enjoyed if death had occurred later. Thus, all of us who take the law of non-contradiction seriously face a major philosophical problem.

Taylor's book is divided into four sections. The first is concerned with classical discussions of this vexing issue; the second with contemporary discussions of it. The third section deals with the more general question of whether persons can be harmed by events that occur after they die. The fourth is concerned with various issues in bioethics having to do with death, such as posthumous organ removal, suicide, and permanent loss of consciousness.

A number of the essays are of particular interest. In part I, Martha Nussbaum discusses how her views concerning this issue have changed over time. She now sides with the deprivationists against the Epicureans. She concludes that, although the Epicurean argument is powerful, "most deaths are bad for people . . . because they interrupt their cherished projects, altering the shape of their lives." (p. 35) Kai Draper sides with Epicurus. Here is his analysis. On the one hand, Epicurus did claim that death is not intrinsically bad. Death is not like torture, for there is no one to suffer it. On the other hand, Epicurus did not claim that death is not comparatively bad. The belief that he did is based on the illicit inference from the claim that there is no time at which we are harmed by death to the claim that death does not harm us. Draper says: "For it is quite obvious that an event or state of affairs can be comparatively bad for someone without being so at any specific time." (p. 73)

In part II, Steven Luper argues that even though a preferentialist theory of value is correct, it is not rational (usually) to avoid the harm of death by adapting our desires so that none of our desires are frustrated by death. Hence, one strategy for avoiding the Epicurean difficulty is unsound. Stephen Rosenbaum defends Epicurus against the objections of the deprivationists. He notes that many reject the view of Epicurus by arguing that: "if being dead is not bad for people, then killing them would not be wrong." (162) Killing people is wrong. Therefore, being dead is bad for people. Rosenbaum rejects the conditional. He says "One would need to justify the principle that killing humans is morally wrong only if death is bad for them. I do not readily see how one could argue plausibly for this thesis, and I am unaware of any argument for the principle." (p. 162) Rosenbaum backs up his view by saying that "the question of whether there is moral obligation as a distinct sort and whether it is 'better' than some kind of non-moral obligation is vast and not amenable to proper discussion here." (p. 165)

Many people believe that your death can be harmful to you only if there can be such a thing as a posthumous harm. Part III of Taylor's book is concerned with the general question of whether or not a person can be harmed by an event or a situation that occurs after her life ceases. After an excellent, wide-ranging discussion of alternative strategies for dealing with the problem raised by Epicurus, Geoffrey Scarre discusses the case of someone who identifies herself with the project of saving Venice from sinking under the rising sea. Scarre concludes that if "the city were saved for centuries more, then that would have a positive impact on her well-being antemortem." (p. 179) Barbara Baum Levenbook also defends the posthumous harm thesis. She argues that one can be as degraded by unconsented sex when in an irreversible coma as when the coma is reversible. Unconsented sex is degrading when one is in a reversible coma. When one is in an irreversible coma, one is dead. Therefore, events that occur after one's death can detrimentally affect one's welfare. (p. 198)

In part IV John Harris vigorously argues that "It is doubtful as to whether there is any such thing as a posthumous right." (p. 216) Walter Glannon addresses the issue of whether individuals with very severe brain injuries survive the events that caused them. (p. 245) He discusses "the metaphysical and ethical aspects of survival on the assumptions that we are essentially persons rather than human organisms and that the relevant concept of identity is narrative rather than numerical identity." (p. 249). He applies this distinction to the question of whether someone who is permanently unconscious but not legally dead can be harmed by being a vital organ donor. Glannon claims that

only persons can have interests. Thus only persons can benefit from or be harmed by removing life support or organs from their bodies. Human organisms cannot have interests and therefore cannot benefit from or be harmed by actions done to them because they lack the capacity for consciousness that is necessary to have interests. (p. 262)

For years I have believed both that a deprivation account of the harm of death is clearly correct and that Epicurus's "no subject" argument is both sound and incompatible with such a deprivation account. I am not prepared to give up the law of non-contradiction. This shows that I do not know how to resolve a flaw in my philosophical understanding. (No doubt, others will say: "That's only one of many!") Nothing in Taylor's book has persuaded me to change my mind. Indeed, it has provided me with evidence for reaffirming my view.

Take Nussbaum's view. Epicurus would say: "Of course, death can't interrupt my cherished projects before I die because my death has not yet taken place. It can interrupt my cherished projects after I die. But how can that make my death bad for me? I no longer exist." Nussbaum does not give us a response. Ultimately, she just offers us her deprivationist intuition. Scarre says that if saving Venice from sinking under the sea is my cherished project, and if Venice does not sink under the sea in future centuries after my death, the preservation of Venice can have a "positive impact" on my well-being ante-mortem. Therefore, there can be post-mortem harm. But 'has impact' is a causal term. One wonders how an event later in time can affect a situation earlier in time. Of course, the project in question is affected. And plainly the project is my project. But how does it follow that I am affected? Scarre owes us an argument.

The difficulty here is that we can, and do, make a distinction between self-regarding and other-regarding interests. The Venice project seems plainly to be an other-regarding interest. Having other-regarding interests makes us better persons, and so having those interests is good for us. The trouble is that it just does not follow that the fulfillment of those interests after we die is good for us either before we die or after we die or that the thwarting of those interests after we die is bad for us either before we die or after we die. Of course, we may derive satisfaction from the fulfillment of other-regarding interests. Nevertheless, we can derive that satisfaction only if we are alive. Scarre and Nussbaum need to show that this sort of objection fails.

Draper's claim that some misfortunes cannot be located in time seems correct. Nevertheless, others can be. It is difficult to believe that death is not in the latter class. First think of death as an event. Read an obituary. It will tell you the temporal location of the death of the deceased. Now think of death as a condition. The condition began at the time one became dead. Such talk is commonplace. It supports the view that death is the sort of misfortune that is located in time. Draper has a gap in his argument to fill.

The problem with Rosenbaum's view is that, as some philosophers have suggested, as hard as it may be to offer a general analysis of harm that is free of all difficulties, surely a condition of the adequacy of any account of harm is that it is compatible with the view that our (premature) death is a great harm to us and, indeed, that the wrongness of killing us is based on the great harm to us of our (premature) deaths. If this is so, then Rosenbaum has not shown that our vexing issue involving Epicurus is resolved in favor of Epicurus.

I don't believe that being in an irreversible coma is a sufficient condition for being dead. However, let us suppose, with Levenbook, that it is. Does Levenbook's unconsented sex with a comatose person example show that there can be posthumous harm? The trouble is that there is another analysis of this case. In my view, one should reject an analysis of the wrongness of unconsented sex that makes that wrongness solely a function of the harm done to the victim (precisely because of cases of sex with a comatose person). Instead, the wrongness of the rape of an adult should be understood primarily in terms of the wrongness of the failure to respect a person. There clearly can be failures of respect for a person in which a person is not harmed, indeed, in which a person is benefitted. (Think of some cases of unconsented medical treatment.) Therefore, we cannot simply infer that unconsented sex with a comatose patient -- which is clearly degrading to the patient -- is harmful and is detrimental to her welfare. Accordingly, unconsented sex cases are not sufficient to show, as Levenbook claims, that posthumous harm is possible. In the sex after death case, it is the person who did exist, but no longer exists, who is degraded and not respected. Surely there can be posthumous wrongs. However, this is not problematic in the way that posthumous harms are, because harming seems to involve causation, whereas wronging does not. Plainly one can wrong the dead (or better, the person who used to exist). Think of breaking a will. Harming a person who used to exist raises problems of a sort that wronging does not.

If this is correct, then Harris's claim that posthumous rights are problematic is false. Glannon's claim that human organisms cannot have interests seems also false. I have interests. I am a human organism. Therefore, at least one human organism has interests. Glannon could avoid this disastrous consequence by adopting some radically dualist view of what we are. However, surely such a counterintuitive view needs a lot of defense, which Glannon does not provide. By the way, I am sure that such an attempted defense would be unsuccessful.

In my view, Taylor's collection is valuable, but not because there is a solution somewhere within it to a problem that has bedeviled philosophy for millennia. In particular, insisting on our strong deprivationist intuitions (which in other contexts I have -- notoriously -- strongly insisted upon and defended) does not resolve the problem. Rather, reflection on Taylor's collection provides evidence (after some analysis) for the view that an enduring philosophical problem is still with us. Or perhaps (I say this with tongue in cheek) it indicates that the view that we no longer exist after we die leads to such great philosophical difficulties that we are forced to the conclusion that we do exist after we die! Hey, folks, a new proof for the immortality of the soul!