The Metaphysics of Everyday Life: An Essay in Practical Realism

Placeholder book cover

Lynne Rudder Baker, The Metaphysics of Everyday Life: An Essay in Practical Realism, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 253pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521880497.

Reviewed by Charlotte Witt, University of New Hampshire


Lynne Rudder Baker's new book The Metaphysics of Everyday Life provides a useful overview of her metaphysical position, the Constitution View, and her related theory of persons. The book presents her views in some detail, discusses a wide range of related metaphysical topics (like time, causation, and three-dimensionalism), discusses rival theories, and responds to criticisms of her theories. The last feature, Baker's inclination to respond in detail to her critics, is commendable although it makes the narrative of her book difficult to follow at times. Baker also argues in some detail for Practical Realism, the label she uses for her kind of metaphysical inquiry: "My aim is to see the metaphysical significance of the world as we encounter and interact with it -- all day every day." (p. 240) The Metaphysics of Everyday Life is a very rich book both in conception and in detail, and it makes an important contribution to contemporary metaphysics.

Constitution is an ontological relationship of unity that holds between individuals of different primary kinds.

It is a relationship that may hold between granite slabs and war memorials, between pieces of metal and traffic signs, between DNA molecules and genes, between pieces of paper and dollar bills -- things of basically different kinds that are spatially coincident. (p. 32)

Baker holds that every familiar object that we encounter in the world is a constituted object, and that, ultimately, every one of them is constituted by a sum of particles. Constitution is a relationship of unity but not identity: The piece of paper is not identical to the dollar bill because it is of a different primary kind with different de re persistence conditions. The notion that every existing object is of just one primary kind, and has its primary kind property essentially, is a core assumption of the Constitution View. The key puzzle facing Baker is to explain how two individuals of different primary kinds can become numerically one. How can the piece of paper become one with the dollar bill if they are members of different primary kinds, with different essential properties and different de re persistence conditions? Aren't they two individuals contingently occupying the same spatial location?

Aristotle's response to this question is to deny that the paper is an individual of a primary kind with de re persistence conditions, which is independent of the dollar bill it. Baker does not follow Aristotle on this point, and instead points out that the "two way borrowing of properties" between the piece of paper (it is valuable because it is a dollar bill) and the dollar bill (it is 5" long because the paper is 5" long) is evidence for the claim that constitution is a unity relationship. The difficulty comes not with the idea that constitution is a unity relationship of some kind or other, but with the idea of numerical oneness. How can constitution both relate two individuals of essentially different kinds (two objects) and be a relationship of numerical unity (one object)? Baker refers to Aristotle's notion of accidental sameness as a historical precedent for attributing numerical oneness to an accidental (or contingent) combination of different individuals like a musical man, which is a combination of a substance and an accident. Beings that are accidentally the same (the musical man, the pale man) are numerically one according to Aristotle. But, these beings are not combinations of two individuals of different primary kinds with different de re persistence conditions; they are combinations of substances (= Baker's individuals) and accidents, and accidents are ontologically dependent upon substances for Aristotle. So, it is not clear that Aristotle does provide a historical precedent for the concept of unity (= numerical oneness) without identity. Another aspect of constitution does provide grounds for a unity without identity claim, and that is the idea that the identity of the constituted object is given by its primary kind and not the primary kind of the constituter.

If x constitutes y at t, there is a unified individual whose identity is provided by y's primary kind. If a piece of marble constitutes a statue, the piece of marble does not cease to exist, but (I can only put it metaphorically) its identity is encompassed or subsumed by the statue. (p. 166)

This is a crucial step in rendering the unity without identity aspect of constitution coherent, and I do not think that Baker's metaphors will do the job without further explanation. Since the idea of unity without identity is central to the Constitution View, Baker owes us an explanation of how the subsumption of identity differs from plain old identity.

The importance of the coherence of the idea of unity without identity is particularly pressing in Baker's discussion of persons. According to Baker, human persons are constituted by human organisms (or human bodies) but persons and human organisms belong to different primary kinds with different de re persistence conditions. Persons have first person perspectives necessarily, while human organisms (or human bodies) do not. A first person perspective is an internal, subjective self-consciousness that allows us to reflect upon ourselves, our mortality, our subjectivity, etc. A human organism is defined biologically, in terms of species membership. A baby is a human organism, but not yet a person. When a human organism constitutes a person, however, what results is not two substances/individuals contingently co-habitating, but rather a unified human person whose identity is determined by its being a person, and not by its being a human organism. The core idea of unity without identity, therefore, allows Baker to avoid substance dualism in her theory of human persons. Human persons are numerically one, and not two. Without a clear explanation of why the identity conditions of a human person are those of a person, however, and neither those of a human being nor a combination of both. Baker's theory remains open to the criticism of substance dualism.

What is a baby? Surprisingly perhaps, Baker argues that a baby is a person, and not just a human organism as might seem to be implied by the Constitution View of persons. To accomplish this transformation Baker defines what it is to have a rudimentary first person perspective, common to babies and certain other animals, and then she differentiates babies from the other animals because their rudimentary first person perspective normally develops into a robust first person perspective. "A being with a rudimentary first-person perspective is a person only if it is of a kind that normally develops robust first-person perspectives." (p. 79) The "normally" in this necessary condition can be read in two ways. In the first way it is a statistical notion, and it means what usually happens. But that reading would have the consequence that if (due to a series of unfortunate events) many babies did not develop a first person perspective then babies would not be persons (even if many of them did develop a first person perspective). This result seems arbitrary. On the other hand, if we take the "normally" to describe the capacities that a certain kind of organism ought to develop to count as a normal member of that kind, we can avoid the arbitrary result. But, this reading makes the species membership of the baby part of the definition of what it is to be a person. And this seems to violate one basic requirement of the Constitution View, namely that if x constitutes y, then x and y belong to different primary kinds. And it also seems to run counter to Baker's idea that if x constitutes y at t, there is a unified individual whose identity is provided by y's primary kind since the baby's primary kind (person) is defined with reference to being a human organism. This issue is not crucial for Baker's view, however, since there is nothing wrong with classifying a baby as a human organism who will likely become a person down the road.

Baker's Constitution View and her theory of persons are in principle independent from one another, although it is likely that a major motivation for the development of the Constitution View is that it allows Baker to articulate a theory of persons that is simultaneously naturalistic (responsive to biological facts) and respectful of the ontological uniqueness of persons. "I know of no view of human persons other than the Constitution View that satisfies both these desiderata: Human persons are wholly natural, yet ontologically distinctive." (p. 87) But, the Constitution View would be a compelling theory of the material world quite independently of her theory of persons. It could be the case, for example, that we are just human organisms constituted by a body (or a sum of organs), and that during a certain phase of our existence we (or many of us) have a first person perspective, the capacity for which is essential to being the kind of organism that we are. All of the richness of our experience of the world and its objects would survive this alteration in Baker's view of persons, including our ordinary understanding of causation, the existence of artifacts and other intention dependent beings, and the first person perspective which underlies our morality, the meaningfulness of our lives and our sense that we are different from other animals.

The Metaphysics of Everyday Life is an essay in the tradition that P. F. Strawson over fifty years ago called "descriptive metaphysics". It brings together into one volume Baker's thoughts on a wide range of issues, it provides energetic and detailed replies to her critics, and it records several thoughtful revisions to her original theory. The Constitution View is an original and substantial metaphysical theory, and this book provides a useful overview and expansion of it. Although the Preface and Introduction attempt to root Baker's project in common sense, and to orient the non-specialist reader, many of the discussions are quite technical, and require specialized knowledge. Philosophers and graduate students interested in metaphysics will find the book stimulating and important.