The Metaphysics of Relations

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Anna Marmodoro and David Yates (eds.), The Metaphysics of Relations, Oxford University Press, 2016, 282pp., $74.00, ISBN 9780198735878.

Reviewed by Phil Corkum, University of Alberta


This volume of thirteen commissioned chapters and an introduction provides state of the art contributions to both the philosophical discussion of relations and our understanding of the history of this discussion. It is a model of how historical scholarship and contemporary philosophy can complement each other. Part of the success of the approach here lies in its subtlety. The interconnections between the history and the current philosophy are not belabored: the contemporary work is not dragged down with discussion of precedents and the historical issues are developed on their own terms and without the imposition of anachronism. Thematic interconnections emerge organically, and the resulting whole is satisfying.

I cannot discuss each chapter in detail but I will sketch a question which illustrates one of the threads running through the volume. Can relations be reduced to monadic properties? When I say that Simmias is larger than Socrates, I am claiming in part that each has a relational property -- being larger than Socrates and being smaller than Simmias, respectively. But it is attractive to many philosophers to go further, and explain the relational statement by reference to just non-relational or intrinsic properties. For example, one well might hold that Simmias is larger than Socrates solely because of their respective sizes, and not in virtue of some relation over and above these properties.

Many of the historical responses to this question can be fruitfully viewed in light of Aristotle's discussion of relatives in Categories 7. Aristotle's aim here is partly to explain our usage of sentences such as 'Simmias is larger' and 'Aesop is a slave'. Aristotle holds that relatives constitute one of the categories other than substances, along with qualities, quantities and so on. Relatives are accidents or contingent properties belonging to, present in, and ontologically dependent on, individual substances. This might suggest to the reader that Aristotle is engaged in the reductivist project described above. And indeed many scholars view Aristotle as offering a reduction of relations to monadic properties: to give just two recent examples, Paul Studtmann (2014) and Jeffrey Brower (2015) endorse this reading. But it is not clear to me that Aristotle is engaged in this project. Aristotle offers two definitions or characterizations of relatives. His first stab is:

We call relatives (pros ti) all such things as are said to be just what they are, of or than other things, or in some other way in relation to (pros) something else. For example, what is larger is called what it is than something else (it is called larger than something) (6a36-39).

But this definition does not exclude substances and their parts. For example, what it is to be a human hand is to be a body part of a whole human substance. Aristotle recognizes this problem and takes a second stab at a definition:

Now if the definition of relatives (tōn pros ti) which was given above was adequate, it is either exceedingly difficult or impossible to reach the solution that no substance is spoken of as a relative (tōn pros ti). But if it was not adequate, and if those things are relatives (ta pros ti) for which being is the same as being somehow related to something (pros ti), then perhaps some answer may be found (8a28-33).

The translations of Aristotle are from J.L. Ackrill (1963). I won't go into all of the interpretative complications arising from these two passages. But let me ask: What are relatives? Anna Marmodoro (§1), in her contribution to the editor's introduction and in her (2014), takes relatives to be directed monadic properties. Talk of 'directed' properties corresponds to Aristotle's use of the Greek phrase pros ti more literally than its usual translation as 'relative', 'related to something' or some such expression. (The Greek pros is a preposition with a core meaning of motion towards with the accusative; ti is the indefinite pronoun in the accusative; so pros ti is literally 'towards something'.) I'm not confident I understand what it is to be a directed property. But the Marmodoro interpretation qualifies the picture of Aristotle as a reductionist. For on this reading, Aristotle is perhaps neither a realist, since he explains relations by reference to monadic properties, nor a full blown reductionist, since these directed properties retain a relational flavor. I would be tempted to go further. For I doubt that Aristotle has a reductionist agenda at all. As we have seen, Aristotle is at pains to distinguish relatives from at least some items of other categories. Both of Aristotle's definitions look strikingly like an account of relational properties in terms of ineliminable relations. For an interpretation somewhat along these lines, see Mario Mignucci (1986). If this reading is right, then for Aristotle talk of relations is not eliminable from metaphysics.

Some other historical figures take a more straightforwardly realist stance towards relations. For example, Plato arguably takes relations to be irreducible polyadic properties. For Plato, a concrete individual exhibits a property in virtue of participating in a Form. Theodore Scaltsas (§2) argues that Plato accommodates for relations by allowing for plural participation in a Form. Callias and Hippias are two by plural participation in the Form of Two -- only together do the pair exhibit a single instance of the Form's feature of duality. Scaltsas suggests that relatives plural participate in opposite Forms. Simmias is larger than Socrates in virtue of Simmias participating in the Large and Socrates in the Small -- but this is a plural participation and not two distinct single participations, in part since it explains a single instance of the relation. And as Brower (§3) notes in his helpful overview of the medieval debates, it is a minority view among medieval philosophers that relations are irreducible polyadic properties.

Most medievals, however, account for relations in terms of monadic properties. Although I have questioned the usual interpretation of Aristotle as reductionist, this tendency among medieval philosophers may partly be motivated by extending the Aristotelian position that relatives are accidents present in substances: if there are relations, then they must be inherent accidents of some kind. Sydney Penner (§4) argues that many medieval philosophers reject polyadic accidents since they lack location: they can be located neither in the relata (for then the relation would be multiply located and divided) nor in between (for then the relation would take on features distinctive of substances). But the medievals arguably reject Aristotle's own account of relatives and offer alternative reductions of relations to monadic properties. As Brower details, one reduction strategy involves explaining relations in terms of accidents in such other categories as quality. This approach might resemble the first Simmias-Socrates example of reduction given above: the fact that Simmias is larger than Socrates may be explained by appeal to their respective size qualities. Others, such as John Duns Scotus, aim to explain relations in terms of sui generis accidents -- monadic properties not falling under one of the other categories. On this strategy, the fact that Simmias is larger than Socrates is explained by appeal to a pair of accidents necessitated by, but distinct from, their respective sizes.

Before moving on, let me note that Aristotle's emphasis on relatives continues to influence. Maureen Donnelly (§5), for example, draws on a broadly Aristotelian notion of a relative to defend positionalism, the view that relations hold of their relata in a particular order.

I have sketched some of the historical responses to the question whether relations can be reduced to monadic properties. Many of the contemporary responses to this question can be viewed in light of David Lewis's discussion of internal relations. Lewis (1986, 62) writes:

An internal relation is one that supervenes on the intrinsic natures of its relata: if X1 and Y1 stand in the relation but X2 and Y2 do not, then there must be a difference in intrinsic nature either between the Xs or else between the Ys.

Lewis allows that there are such non-internal relations as spatiotemporal relations. But Lewis's discussion suggests a strategy for reductionists: show that a certain class of relations are really internal relations -- that is to say, relations which supervene on the intrinsic monadic properties of their relata. Something like this strategy is shared among the authors of several of the chapters of the volume -- with a tweak I will next explain.

The supervenient is commonly thought to be nothing over and above its subvenient base. If reductionists succeed in showing that a class of relations supervene on intrinsic properties, then these relations are ontologically innocent. The supervenient, however, is generally neither equivalent to, nor dependent on, its subvenient base. For example, if mental facts supervene on physical facts, this fails to establish their identity. It is perhaps partly for these reasons that the reductivist strategy I just described is tweaked in some way or other. Here is one example. First, reduce certain apparently non-internal relations to internal relations. Next, show that internal relational truths have truthmakers involving just the relata and their monadic properties. The connection between a truth and its truthmaker is a stronger relation than that between the supervenient and its base. Some view truthmaking as a kind of grounding relation. So, if this strategy succeeds, then apparent relations are arguably grounded in non-relational properties.

John Heil (§8), for example, argues that causal relations are internal relations and causal truths are made true by the mutual manifestations of powers or dispositions. For example, water has a power to dissolve salt, and salt has a reciprocal power to be dissolved by water. A particular pair of manifestations of these powers suffices for a certain claim of water causing salt to dissolve to be true. David Yates (§9) and Michael Esfeld (§13) question the view of causal powers as internal relations. Peter Simons (§7) goes in some ways further than Heil, arguing that even spatiotemporal relations reduce to the internal relations among the processes upon which the relata ontologically depend. And the late E. J. Lowe (§6) applies a similar strategy for a wide variety of apparently external relations. Notice that where Lewis's own discussion suggests an attenuated reductionist project, since he allows that there are non-internal spatiotemporal relations, Lowe and perhaps Simons offer full-blown reductionism.

It is a somewhat separate issue how subsequently to take talk of relations. Even if one holds that relations are ontologically innocent, or grounded in intrinsic properties, one might view talk of relations either permissively as an innocuous conceit, or dismissively as a misleading deceit. For example, both Lowe and Heil argue that relational truths have as truthmakers states of affairs with just monadic properties and their bearers. But where Heil finds the monadic truthmakers to render talk of relations harmless, Lowe finds such talk pointless. Lowe's discussion is quick and, sadly, it would have been good to have heard more. In brief: Lowe finds relations to be weird. His reasons for this view invites comparison with the medieval objection, discussed by Penner, that relations lack location.

In sharp contrast to reductionists, structural realists hold that the relational structure of reality, as discovered by fundamental physics, is ontologically basic. Such realists reject intrinsic natures. Some eliminate things altogether while others believe that there are individuals but these have only relational properties. Chapters 10-14 of the volume present a range of positions on this issue. James Ladyman (§11) and Mauro Dorato (§14) defend a relational interpretation of quantum mechanics. Nora Berenstain (§10) argues that the relevant structure need not be causal. Esfeld (§13) argues that quantum mechanics is consistent with an ontology of objects. Sebastian Briceño and Stephen Mumford (§12) object that an ontology of structure would not allow us to distinguish a world-kind from its concrete instances.

I will mention just one point of connection with the preceding discussion. As we've seen, some reductionists aim to show that a given class of apparently external relations are internal relations which supervene on intrinsic properties. Ladyman argues that there are relations which do not supervene on the intrinsic properties of their relata. One example is entangled states in quantum physics. Ladyman (180) notes that "standard quantum mechanics does not attribute complete separate states to individual particles in entangled states even though they may be a great distance apart." Of course, Ladyman does not hold that such supervenience failure on its own establishes that there is only a structural ontology. And I've tried to suggest that the usefulness of talk of relations within metaphysics need not stand or fall on the question of their covariation with intrinsic properties. But Ladyman's cases do lend support for the view that there are ineliminable relational properties, and so a robust metaphysics of relations.


Ackrill, J. L. (1963). Aristotle's Categories and De Interpretatione. Translated with Notes and Glossary. Oxford University Press.

Brower, J. (2015). "Medieval Theories of Relations," The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, Edward N. Zalta (ed.).

Lewis, D. (1986). On the Plurality of Worlds. Blackwell Publishers.

Marmodoro, A. (2014). Aristotle on Perceiving Objects. Oxford University Press.

Mignucci, M. (1986). "Aristotle's Definitions of Relatives in Cat. 7," Phronesis 31: 101-127. 

Studtmann, P. (2014). "Aristotle's Categories," The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, Edward N. Zalta (ed.).