The Metaphysics of Truth

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Douglas Edwards, The Metaphysics of Truth, Oxford University Press, 2018, 198pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198758693.

Reviewed by Steven D. Hales, Bloomsburg University


A spectre is haunting truth -- the spectre of deflationism. It looms over Douglas Edwards's entire discussion, and is the central foil of his book. Unlike Marx, who wanted to defend the spectre of communism, Edwards wishes to dismiss that of deflationism. The book makes the argument not only for a substantive theory of truth, but for a pluralist theory of truth, grounded in a metaphysics of properties. More than that, Edwards is concerned with developing a broadly-unified metaphysics that includes a pluralist ontology -- not just that there are different fundamental categories of entity, but that there are distinct modes of existence itself. The book is titled The Metaphysics of Truth, but its arguments extend more broadly than one might guess from that alone. One thing about the book: it is comprehensive. If there is a theory of truth, then Edwards takes a look at it. Correspondence, coherence, semantic, superassertability, primitivism, pluralism, redundancy, performative, and prosentential theories, and new-wave deflationism all get a look. And that doesn't touch the various theories of properties and existence that he discusses.

Edwards begins by laying out the case for truth's being a property. There are two main arguments for this: linguistic and metaphysical. The linguistic case is that predicates refer to properties and that "is true" is a predicate. "Is true" sure looks like the piece of language that we call a predicate, but -- naturally -- there has been some disagreement. The ultradeflationists all think that "is true" is really up to something else besides predicating a truth property. According to redundancy theories, to assert "Queen Anne is dead is true" is just a repetitive way of stating the simpler "Queen Anne is dead." Under the performative theory, "Playa Cancun has the best tacos in town is true" is like saying "Honestly, Playa Cancun has the best tacos in town." "Is true," like "honestly," is an intensifier that adds no semantic content. For the prosentential approach, "is true" functions analogously to pronouns. Once the subject of a sentence is made clear with a proper name, we can unambiguously refer to that subject with "he", "she", and "it". Similarly, if you assert "Mission Impossible 3 was better than Mission Impossible 4" and I rejoin "that's true," what I'm doing is using a prosentence to affirm what you said.

Edwards very nicely dispatches the first two approaches while showing the last to be compatible with truth as a property. In addition, he offers some metaphysical reasoning to think that if truth is a thing at all, then a property is the kind of thing it is. The next move by the deflationists is to grudgingly concede that, well, maybe truth is a property of some sort, but it is not a substantive property. A good bit of this debate revolves around what constraints we see on an adequate theory of truth. Edwards makes clear that he is adopting the method of reflective equilibrium -- we shouldn't expect any laundry list of desiderata to be completely satisfied by any one theory. Instead we ought to go for the theory that, on balance, does the most. In the case of truth, a couple of major things we'd like is for the truth predicate to be generalizable (e.g. "everything Sarah said is true") and satisfying Tarskian disquotation (e.g. that snow is white can be inferred from "'snow is white' is true"). Inflationary theories, which hold that "is true" expresses a substantial property, are more than just deflationism plus some additional feature. They give very different explanations of why generalization and disquotation hold.

What exactly makes a property a substantive one? Edwards identifies two key dimensions: whether there are genuine similarities between bearers of the property, and whether there is legitimate explanatory role for the property. There have been various proposals about what it is for truth to be a substantial property -- that it is opaque, or a purely logical property, or one that is constituted of more primitive properties. Edwards argues that none of these ideas withstand close scrutiny, and proposes that a distinction between abundant and sparse properties is the right way to capture the metaphysics of deflationary and inflationary truth.

Sparse properties ground a genuine similarity among their bearers, and have a causal-explanatory role. These are often taken to be abstract universals. "Is metallic" is an example of such a property. Abundant properties are just nominalist predicate extensions, like "is red or a turkey;" there is no natural similarity or explanatory unity among things that are either red or a turkey. When it comes to "is true," deflationists think it expresses an abundant property and inflationists think it expresses a sparse property.

Deflationists claim the austerity of their view makes most metaphysical issues regarding truth obsolete, and is the default position on truth, thereby requiring all other theories to demonstrate their superiority. For deflationists

(1) the sentence 'p' is true iff p, and
(2) the proposition <p> is true iff p

together comprise a total theory of truth. The deflationist conception of truth adds a few more things, namely that (1) and (2) are basic, that they explain all uses of the truth predicate, that instances of them are given without making any essential connections between truth and other concepts, and that they do not entail a substantive truth property. Edwards is doubtful about most of what deflationists have to offer. He argues that deflationists are actually giving a complex view about how language relates to the world and dressing it up as a neutral and innocuous theory of truth. While deflationism originally advertised itself as addressing only abundant, nonsubstantial properties (and insisting that truth is one of these), to acknowledge a difference in properties at all is to concede that in the case of sparse properties there are metaphysically substantial facts about reference, and that at least some properties are more than merely the extension of predicates. In other words, deflationism rapidly expands to a global position that aims to deflate all properties, predicates, and concepts.

As part of a broader project to describe the relationship between language and the world and how that bears on a theory of truth, Edwards next digs deeper into the metaphysics of predicates. He offers a lengthy list of different kinds of predicates -- moral, biological, institutional, comic, social, modal, etc. -- to highlight how some predicates seem responsive to objective differences in the world, and others seem to have properties that are projections of the predicates themselves. "Is acidic" arises out of sparse properties already in the world, but "is cool" does not. Motorcycles are cool because they fall under the predicate "is cool" rather than conversely.

One of his distinctions is between properties with a broad cosmological role (they feature in the explanations of things that cannot be explained by reference to our beliefs that things have those properties) and those with narrow cosmological roles (everything else). Does the predicate "being either cosmologically broad or narrow" refer to a broad property or a narrow one? The question is whether a metaphysics of properties is just an account of our beliefs about properties or if that metaphysics has objective explanatory power. What's the status of Edwards's own theorizing here? Much later he does address whether the predicate "is true" responds to a sparse property of being true or whether it generates an abundant property of being true, but that's not precisely the same issue.

It is also worth mentioning that Edwards's discussion of race and gender predicates is disappointingly uncritical of standard progressive pieties, which makes one worry about the universality of his numerous classificatory distinctions. He argues that racial properties are not reducible to biological properties with a broad cosmological role, and that "the property of being a woman is not the sort of thing that can be reduced to physical characteristics" (p. 74). Edwards even endorses without argument Sally Haslanger's strange claims that in the absence of social oppression and privilege (themselves hardly self-evident categories) there would be no men and women, and no races.

Well, all right, how about <being tall>? Is that a biological property or one whose existence is wholly explained by reference to our beliefs that things have those properties? <Being tall> is contextual (someone tall in philosophy class may not be tall in the NBA) and vague (is a 5'8" woman tall? How about one 5'7"?). However, someone isn't tall just because everyone thinks he is -- it might be widely, but falsely, believed that Tom Cruise is tall because he is an action hero in the movies. The "is tall" predicate is not like "is money", where some colored paper really is money solely because we've all collectively decided to believe that it is. With "is tall" there's some kind of underlying physical fact that determines its correct application, even though there is a social element involved with the contextual parameter and possibly with its ascription at the vague border. The property <is a woman> looks like <is tall> -- someone isn't a woman just because everyone thinks she is, even if there are social facts that can come into play (for example, at the vague border of intersex cases). In short, it may be that not all properties fall cleanly into either broad or narrow cosmological roles.

Edwards claims that constructed reality is formed by stipulating definitions (p. 101), like Haslanger's definitions of "man" and "whiteness." That is at best partly true. "Three strikes and you're out" is true because of the stipulative definitions of "strike (in baseball)" and "out (in baseball)" and the explicitly agreed-upon rules of the game. How about this sentence: "The United States is a capitalist country." There is no stipulative definition of "capitalist" or "capitalism," and the assertion that the US is a capitalist country might be hotly contested, even though everyone agrees that the United States, countries, and capitalism are bits of socially constructed reality. "Bill is an askhole" is true because "askhole" is stipulatively defined as "someone who always asks your advice but never takes it" and we can just consult the Urban Dictionary (and our knowledge of Bill's behavior) to settle it. "Mormons are not Christians" is a sentence about social reality, but stipulative definitions neither establish the predicates "is Mormon" or "is Christian," nor will appeal to such definitions settle whether it is true that Mormons are not Christians. Religious wars start over things like this. Edwards writes, "in the constructed domains the object will have the property because it meets some stipulated definition" (p. 102). But that's not true of probably most constructed domains, which arise organically and without central planning.

Edwards defines predicates as responsive when there are causal interactions between a pre-existing property and our thought and talk about it. For example, the property <being metallic> is both sparse and has a broad cosmological role, and our predicate "is metallic" is responsive to it. Edwards argues that the classic correspondence theory of truth, which holds that the world is the thing that determines the truth, instead of truth being the thing that determines the world, is a natural fit for sentences with responsive predicates. Generative predicates produce abundant properties with a narrow cosmological role, like "is cool." Edwards argues that a pragmatic theory of truth, particularly superassertability, is best suited for sentences with generative predicates. The upshot is truth pluralism. There is more than one correct theory of truth, and it depends on the domain of sentences that are under evaluation.

Edwards draws an analogy between winning as the object of many games, and truth as the object of asserting and believing. There is the general idea of "winning" that takes different forms depending on the game -- there is no one thing to do that lets you win at everything. You have to check on the rules of the specific game at hand to see what is needed to win. Likewise, he argues, there is no reductive account of truth to be had, even if it is always our goal in belief and assertion. You have to see what kinds of predicates you're dealing with to figure out what counts as believing truly. Once his fundamental case for pluralism has been laid out, there's a good bit of inside baseball distinguishing and defending Edwards's version from other forms of pluralism promoted by people like Michael Lynch and Crispin Wright.

With truth pluralism under his belt, Edwards moves on to a defense of ontological pluralism. The arguments proceed in a similar vein: some accounts of existence work well for certain sorts of objects, whereas other accounts work better for other sorts of objects. The Eleatic Principle, which states that only objects with causal powers exist, does nicely with objects with sparse properties (e.g. concrete objects) and pairs well with the correspondence theory of truth. Objects are explanatorily prior to truth. The Neo-Fregean principle, which states that to be is to be the reference of a singular term that appears in a true sentence, works better with objects with abundant properties (e.g. abstract objects) and pairs with the superassertability theory of truth. Truth is explanatorily prior to objects.

I lack the space to discuss Edwards's treatment of truthmaker theories and truth primitivism, but rest assured that he does consider them in his drive to show that truth is a substantial topic after all. Edwards very gradually and carefully builds his case toward pluralism, and there is a great deal of underlying metaphysical structure that supports it. He has an easy, fluid, and comprehensive grasp on the relevant literature, and he uses it in in the best way -- by underwriting his discussion without getting bogged down in long quotations or interpretive minutiae. His book is quite dense and packed with argument, but is extremely methodical, a march from point to point with a clear destination in view. Although this review is only able to briefly discuss some of his many themes, Edwards's book is essential reading for anyone in the thick of these debates.