The Modern Philosophical Revolution: The Luminosity of Existence

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David Walsh, The Modern Philosophical Revolution: The Luminosity of Existence, Cambridge UP, 2008, 501pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521727631.

Reviewed by David S. Pacini, Emory University



It is arguable that the advance of science and technology, together with the global expanse of the languages of political and moral rights, are hallmarks of the modern spirit. To these, David Walsh proposes a third, and presumably equally momentous, trait: the philosophical revolution that has prioritized the horizon of existence within which we find ourselves. Not a sometime insight, as others have argued, but, on Walsh’s reading, a sustained course of inquiry, the shift of perspective to our meditative participation in existence portends the only viable mode of philosophizing. He sets out the case for this claim in The Modern Philosophical Revolution: The Luminosity of Existence, the crown jewel of an unintended trilogy on the problem of ‘modernity’.

The first volume, After Ideology (1990), a study of the crisis evoked by totalitarianism, turns on the claim that the truth of the modern world can only be articulated from within it. From such a perspective, good and evil are the imprescriptable boundaries of our existence. The second volume, The Growth of the Liberal Soul (1997), addresses the underlying question posed by After Ideology: how could various invocations of liberal principles and claims of rights — both natural and human — sustain a consensus in the absence of a coherent overarching intellectual framework? Walsh argues that beneath the superficial incoherence lies an inward coherence that is manifest in existence. In other words, what may not work in theory appears to work in practice. Both After Ideology and The Growth of the Liberal Soul recast this point philosophically, arguing that existence is prior to all formulations of it. The agenda for The Modern Philosophical Revolution is to bring into view the philosophical logic of the insight that existence precedes thought.

In this latest volume, Walsh launches a magnificent elegy over the course of some four hundred and sixty nine pages to the priority of existence essaying eight philosophers from Kant to Derrida. In keeping with his own maxim that philosophy can only be conducted from within, Walsh thinks through the philosophical accomplishments of Kant, Hegel, Schelling, Nietzsche, Heidegger, Levinas, Derrida, and Kierkegaard by way of a close re-reading of their works. Not surprisingly, this is a tome for neither the faint-of-heart nor the philosophically untutored; the level of argumentation places fierce demands upon its reader, presupposing, as it does, a deep knowledge of the figures under consideration. Yet persistence does not go without reward: what first appears as exegetical readings of the eight philosophers under consideration quickly proves to be a highly nuanced set of meditations. And it is these meditations on the works of each thinker that permits Walsh to advance his own thesis. In what follows, I propose (1) to chart briefly the course of his thesis; (2) to bring into view the underlying meditational form that foregrounds his pivotal claims about necessity; and (3) to puzzle over this underlying thesis about necessity in relation to Kierkegaard. Although to pursue an interpretation of Walsh’s The Modern Philosophical Revolution in this way runs the risk of distortion, it also holds out the prospect of casting the principal moves of Walsh’s argument in bold relief.


Walsh takes his beginnings with Kant — or to be more precise, with Kant read through the lens of The Critique of the Power of Judgment. Here the knowledge that the First Critique seemed to claim is rooted in the subject becomes, instead, the subject’s submission to ‘regulative ideas’ in order to understand reality. In other words, Walsh does not take Kant’s fundamental question to be: “What are the conditions under which experience becomes possible?” Instead, Kant’s fundamental question is: “What is the way of being through which knowledge appears?” In this orientation, Walsh follows Heidegger’s (and S.T. Coleridge’s) conviction that Kant is concerned less with epistemology and more with the prior ontological conditions that knowledge reveals.

Pursing the point that knowledge is a mode of being within a larger critical framework that remains oriented to a theoretical/practical distinction proved problematic for Kant; the idea of unifying theoretical and practical reason was the rallying point for Kant’s idealist successors. Hegel, in particular, on Walsh’s reading of him, sought to turn philosophy into a living moment, in which the life of philosophy overtakes the writing of it (and so of the breaching of virtually every boundary that philosophy attempts to delineate). Noesis noesos is not, as Kant had thought, the self-awareness of finite knowledge, but instead, according to Walsh’s Hegel, a meditation on the moment of transparency in which finite thinking grasps its existential constitution by the infinite.

The move from (1) asking what is the way of being through which knowledge appears to (2) the attempt to think the moment of one’s existential constitution by the infinite is perilous: it runs the risk of thought claiming to contain its own limits. This, at least, is one way of reading Hegel’s claims about the nature of absolute knowledge, from which Schelling demurred. To his way of thinking, philosophy, when it philosophizes out of its own existence, cannot think its own beginning or coincide with that from which it emerges. Schelling’s point implies not only that the boundary between the theoretical and the practical had to disappear entirely, but also that idealism had failed to effect this outcome.

The collapse of the theoretical and the practical into one — philosophy as existence and existence as philosophy — occurred with Nietzsche. For him, transcending the verbal expression of existence was the only way that the living vitality of existence could be realized. When a fundamentally literary enterprise forswears conceptual content, it paradoxically invokes a formulated truth (that literary claims vitiate the reality of existence), thereby invoking metaphysics to eradicate metaphysics. It can also point, however, not only to the limits of language, but also to the means by which we respond to the pull of existence. Nietzsche considered this means to be art, although by this he has in mind not the artifacts but the way of living that reveals what cannot be revealed: no truth can contain itself.

On Walsh’s telling, it was Heidegger who discerned transcendence in Nietzsche’s paradoxical formulations by which he subverted every dogmatic formulation of truth. The truth of what makes existence possible always lies beyond existence. Accordingly, the pursuit of the truth of existence always requires the unattainability of it. For Heidegger this meant that the possibility of existence resides in an event of being that can never become an event within existence. Further, if being cannot ever become an event within existence, then being must itself be the horizon for an understanding of existence. To pursue being, accordingly, entails the dissolution of all hypostasized entities and of the crystallizing tendency of language in order that the prior that cannot be encapsulated in what it produces (entities and language) might be glimpsed. This, in turn, suggests that existence is a movement from what is never fully present (being) to the truth of being. Eschatological in character, the movement toward the truth of being is, in the end, futile — the indefinite not-yet, becomes the never — inasmuch as that by which the grasping of truth occurs is itself never graspable. Even so, Heidegger avers that contemplation, as the living practice of thought, which is tantamount to the openness toward being that lives out of its illumination, can extend to the Apocalyptic moment of the unconcealedness of being. And in this move, Heidegger conflates the thought of the shift to existence with the thought that existence cannot be contained within thought, thereby containing existence within thought.

The corrective to Heidegger’s breach of his own philosophical insight emerged in the work of Levinas, who espied in Heidegger’s project a fatal orientation to the subject who subsumes all of reality into its own sense of fulfillment. For this reason, Levinas recognized Heidegger’s omission of the “othernesss” of the other that cannot be subsumed under the subject. It is precisely this otherness, which the subject cannot attain, that constitutes the person and directs the course of a philosophy of existence. The unattainability of otherness implies that in dialogue alone — what Levinas calls the responsibility for the other — that which is “beyond being” is glimpsed in a way that is not held hostage to the self-assimilating thought of the subject. The displacement of thinking with dialogue completes the prioritization of practical reason over theoretical reason that Kant inaugurated; reason has been subordinated to the good, to the face of the other that elicits responsibility, calling us into being. For Walsh, Levinas’ triumph is the insight that the non-reachability of otherness, the non-possessability of the infinite, reveals that participation in the infinite is instead through the infinite responsibility by which personhood is constituted.

The full philosophical significance of Levinas’ pivotal insight about the constitutive role of non-reachability of otherness for personhood only came into view, Walsh argues, with the work of Derrida. According to Walsh, Derrida went further than Levinas had ventured. He unseated the Heideggerian assumption (intimation) of the apocalyptic accomplishment of thinking the shift to existence, on the conceptual grounds that such an accomplishment would be immanent. Insofar as immanence annuls the nonrealizability of apocalypse, Derrida underscored the impossibility of attaining the transparency toward which philosophical striving to articulate existence had aimed. This impossibility, in turn, far from disappointing, opened the prospect that such non-transparency was itself salvific.

The peculiar affinity between negative theology and Derrida’s notion of perennial postponement — of the unfolding of existence within an ever-receding horizon that it cannot meet, lest it cease to be — which saves us from our own dissolution, captures Walsh’s eye as a heuristic guide to interpret Derrida’s attraction to Kierkegaard. Long before Derrida, Kierkegaard had argued that life is made possible precisely by its noncontainability within any formulation of it. He pursued this insight through the course of his pseudonymous authorship, in which he maintained that faith is always in what we do not know, and cannot say; even though we cannot say what we mean, we, of necessity, continue to say it, because believing it, we live it. Paradoxical though this may seem, it was Kierkegaard’s way of saying that comprehending the conception of necessity simultaneously negates the conception, rendering it ungraspable. Translated into Christian theological terms, Kierkegaard claimed that Christian teaching is not doctrine but a paradox that must be believed: Christ reveals himself by not revealing himself. So in the absence of Christ, of being, we exist in mercy. With this insight, Walsh comes full circle to his thesis that the modern revolution in philosophy consists in rediscovering the powers by which we are sustained, judged, and saved.


If we are to understand Walsh’s readings in modern philosophy as meditations, then we are well served by recalling that in the classic form of meditation first set out by Marcus Aurelius, the turning point is the movement of anagnorisis. This is the moment in the practice of meditation where a shift in perspective or reframing opens what was previously closed. The power of Walsh’s analyses rests in his ability to move from one moment of meditational anagnorisis to another. Thus we move from Kant’s discovery of the primacy of practical reason as a way of being through which knowledge appears to Hegel’s meditation on the moment of transparency in which finite thinking grasps its existential constitution by the infinite. In turn, we discover with Schelling that we cannot think our own beginning any more than our thinking can coincide with that from which it emerges. If, then, philosophy and existence are to be one, every verbal expression must be transcended, as Nietzsche taught, inasmuch as no truth can contain itself. Heidegger discerned in this dictum the insight that the possibility of existence resides in an event in being that can never become an event in existence; hence, the movement of existence is from what is never fully present to the truth of being. Eschatalogical in character, if not apocalyptic in intimation, Heidegger’s contemplation aspires toward the unconcealedness of being. Levinas shrank from this attempt to contain existence within thought, finding within in it an inchoate orientation toward the subject who absorbs all sense of reality into its own sense of fulfillment. Heidegger’s orientation, so understood, effaces the unattainable otherness of otherness, but for Levinas, that which is beyond being is glimpsed through the primacy of dialogue wherein we are constituted as persons. For Derrida, Levinas’ non-reachability of otherness laid the axe to Heidegger’s apocalyptic surmise that we could think the shift to existence — such was to render the apocalyptic immanent, annulling the nonrealizability of apocalypse. The significance of the non-reachability of otherness for Derrida appears in the disclosure that non-transparency — rather than transparency — or the perennial postponement of the horizon within which existence unfolds is salvific, opening the prospect for meaning. Seen from another perspective, Derrida’s claim is tantamount to the Kierkegaardian observation that life is made possible precisely by its non-containability within any formulation of it. Thus, for Kierkegaard, we cannot, of necessity, say what we mean. Because every comprehension of necessity simultaneously negates it, we are catapulted into living in faith in what we do not know.

Walsh’s argument turns on ‘necessity’. His meditations move from the thought that we are constituted by it in our way of being through which knowledge appears (Kant), to the thought that we can think it (Hegel), to the recognition that we cannot think it (Schelling), but must live it (Nietzsche). We aspire to recognize it as an event that can never become an event in existence (Heidegger), but such striving is little more than an attempt to subsume the unsubsumable into ourselves, effacing our responsibility to live into it, thereby becoming persons (Levinas). Properly understood, necessity is an ever-receding horizon that existence cannot meet (Derrida), which reveals itself precisely by not revealing itself, i.e., as non-graspable (Kierkegaard). Of necessity, we are driven to faith in what we do not know, but by which (mercifully) we are supported and sustained.


It is plausible to summarize Walsh’s thesis in Wittgensteinian fashion by saying that because ‘luminosity’ is not an event in existence, it cannot be ‘said’, but only ‘shows’ as its horizon. It is also plausible to say that although luminosity is not an event in existence, it nonetheless shows only in relation to what is sayable. These ways of formulating Walsh’s thesis help to bring to the surface the problematic relation of his account of ‘necessity’ in the philosophy of existence to historical thinking. In the first formulation, the orientation is away from the subject and objectifying history toward the unreachable horizon within which reason moves. In this sense, philosophy is a non-historical event that appears within history. In the second formulation, the orientation shifts subtly to incorporate the variability of the meaning of historical events through the emphasis on language that always resonates with a range of significances that are not self-contained, but recaptured through the subject’s practice of meditation. In this sense, philosophy is historical recollection that occurs in a world that has forgotten history. The peril of the first formulation is an ahistoricality that absorbs everything into its own purview; the peril of the second formulation is an historical determinism that effaces the nonhistorical showing of anagnorisis in meditation.

I wonder if Walsh has fallen prey to the first peril, precisely because he has worked so hard to avoid the second. The problematic relation of necessity to historical thinking is perhaps evident in Walsh’s treatment of Kierkegaard; in his attempt to avoid the peril of historical determinism, Walsh becomes hostage to an ahistoricality whose internal logic of necessity governs his interpretation. The placement of Kierkegaard at the culmination of his study is consistent with the internal logic (ahistorical) of his larger argument. But it is, as well, symptomatic of the deeper problem of bending the interpretation of Kierkegaard to conform with this commitment to philosophy as a non-historical event that appears within history. In his determination to lift the weight of historical distance, thereby rendering Kierkegaard a contemporary, by virtue of the priority of the person over history, Walsh minimizes his difference from us.

But Kierkegaard, by his own reckoning in The Point of View of My Work as an Author: A Report to History, is different. He is a religious author, whose own poetic and philosophical production is a “deceit”, while at the same time a “necessary emptying out” for the purpose of becoming a Christian. His work as a committed Christian is a challenge to the “monstrous illusion” of Copenhagen’s Christendom. Backed by the authority of both church and state, the Christianity of his time could readily dismiss criticism. To expose its bankruptcy was costly at many levels; Kierkegaard adopted the aesthetical incognito, the deceit, in order to insinuate those under illusion into truth.

It was within this very specific historical undertaking that Kierkegaard sought to clarify his interpretation of his authorship:

If I were to go ahead and say from the beginning I had had a clear view of the whole dialectical construction of the entire authorship, or that every moment step by step, I had by anticipation so far exhausted the possibilities that later reflection has not taught me anything, or at times something different; that what I had done was surely right, yet only now did I now correctly understand it — if I were to do this, then it would be a denial of God and dishonesty towards Him. No, I must say that I cannot understand the whole, just because to the merest insignificant detail I understand it and yet by no means dare to say that at the moment of commencing I understood it so precisely — and yet I am the one who carried it out and took every step with reflection …

Were I now to express with the utmost categorical precision that Governance had in my whole activity as a writer, I know of no more suggestive or decisive expression than this: it is Governance that has educated me and the education is reflected in the productivity’s process (Point of View, pp. 72, 73, 74).

Kierkegaard, while executing his work and reflecting upon it, glimpses, in a moment (anagnorisis), that faith through which he lives and acts: he is the instrument of a Governance that guides his life and his work. The historical resonances of Christian discourse, of Creator, Redeemer, Spirit, and Providence attach to ‘Governance’, all of which are words that summon forth recollections of the showing of the non-graspable necessity of the horizon within which we live. In such moments, Kierkegaard teaches us, the inescapable relation of historical thinking and the nongraspability of necessity show, pressing back against the encroachments of the logic of a-historicity — encroachments that threaten to compromise Walsh’s otherwise masterful work.