The Moral and Political Philosophy of Immigration: Liberty, Security, and Equality

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José Jorge Mendoza, The Moral and Political Philosophy of Immigration: Liberty, Security, and Equality, Lexington Books, 2017, 141pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498508513.

Reviewed by Douglas MacKay, University of North Carolina at Chapel Hill


Four months into the presidency of Donald Trump, it is a common refrain that the Trump administration is "not ready to govern." Many take some comfort in this; the Trump administration's incompetence has arguably made the realization of Candidate Trump's campaign promises less likely -- e.g. repealing the Affordable Care Act. However, the Trump administration has made significant progress towards fulfilling Candidate Trump's promises regarding immigration enforcement. Trump has signed two executive orders that, among other things, direct the Secretary of Homeland Security to use state and local police officers to enforce immigration law, and widen the scope of undocumented immigrants prioritized for removal. These executive orders appear to have been effective. As Caitlin Dickerson reported in The New York Times, in the first 3 months of the Trump Presidency, immigration arrests of undocumented immigrants are up 38% compared with the same period last year, and more than half of the increase in arrests involves undocumented immigrants whose only crime is living in the U.S. without legal authorization.

Given this political context, the publication of José Jorge Mendoza's book is particularly timely. This is so since a distinctive feature of the book is its focus on the ethics of immigration enforcement. As I discuss below, Mendoza's account has clear implications regarding the Trump administration's current immigration enforcement activities.

Mendoza's book is not, however, limited to exploring the ethics of immigration enforcement. His central aim is to "situate the issue of immigration at the heart of current Western moral political philosophy," treating it as a foundational problem for political philosophers (xi-xii). To this end, he argues that the contemporary debate regarding immigration is fundamentally about the conflict between the political ideals of liberty, security, and equality (xi-xii). Working through the history of Western political philosophy and the contemporary scholarship on the ethics of immigration, Mendoza spends much of the book seeking a satisfying resolution to the conflict between these ideals. He ultimately arrives at a view he calls "the minimalist defense of immigrant rights," according to which legitimate states have a presumptive duty to justify any restrictions they impose on prospective immigrants, and must recognize certain moral limits on any enforcement activities they undertake (113).

The book is organized into five chapters. Chapters 1 and 2 outline what Mendoza calls the security dilemma and the liberty dilemma, and probe different solutions to them. The security dilemma arises for states with respect to immigration policy because they have a security concern: a responsibility to keep their "subjects safe and provide them with a stable and well-ordered society" (1). In fulfilling this responsibility, Mendoza claims, states must choose between either a state of nature or a state of exception. They can either choose a policy of open borders, which threatens to create a domestic state of nature, or, they can choose to exercise discretionary power with respect to the exclusion, admission, and removal of noncitizens (7). This latter choice, Mendoza claims, is a state of exception in which non-citizens are subject to the lawless power of the state (9). Mendoza claims that the U.S. political system has chosen the latter horn of the security dilemma through the U.S. Plenary Power Doctrine, granting the federal government "complete discretionary control" over the admission, exclusion, and removal of noncitizens (1-5).

States can escape the security dilemma, Mendoza argues, through the institutions of judicial review and constitutional protections for citizens and noncitizens (11). Through these institutions, states avoid a state of exception since neither citizens nor noncitizens are subject to lawless power (11-17); and they avoid a state of nature since constitutional democracy -- the form of sovereignty these institutions embody -- is still a legitimate form of sovereignty (17-20).

Constitutional democracies that successfully resolve the security dilemma, Mendoza claims, still face the liberty dilemma -- the difficulty in "trying to reconcile a commitment to democratic self-determination with individual freedom and universal equality" (25). More specifically, the liberty dilemma forces constitutional democracies to choose between positive and negative liberty since "these two senses of liberty do not always cohere well together" (28). Following Isaiah Berlin, Mendoza defines negative liberty as the sphere in which people are free from the interference of others (28). Positive liberty, Mendoza claims, "is championed by the civic-republican tradition" and "holds that an individual is self-determined or has self-mastery (i.e., autonomy) to the extent that they are active in civic life" (28). Classical liberals, Mendoza claims, opt for the first horn of the liberty dilemma privileging negative liberty "at the expense of universal equality and democratic self-determination" (32). Civic-republicanism, as exemplified by the work of Jean-Jacques Rousseau, by contrast, opts for the latter horn, promoting "democratic self-determination and universal equality through its notion of positive liberty, but only at the expense of individual freedom" (32).

Mendoza argues that John Rawls's justice as fairness largely addresses the liberty dilemma at the domestic level. Rawls's first principle of justice secures citizens' individual freedoms, thus securing their negative liberty, while his second principle of justice ensures that society is not so unequal as to undermine democratic self-determination (46-47). However, Mendoza concludes Chapter 2 by noting that Rawls's focus on the domestic case implies that "it is not clear what kind of kind of guidance [justice as fairness] can provide internationally for cases that involve the liberty, security, and equality of foreigners (e.g., immigration)" (47).

In Chapter 3, Mendoza summarizes the early philosophical debate concerning immigration and argues that it "best exemplifies the liberty dilemma at a more global level" (51-52): communitarians and nationalists opt for political self-determination, while liberal cosmopolitans opt for individual freedom and universal equality (62). In Chapter 4, Mendoza considers "one of the more innovative attempts at resolving this version of the liberty dilemma:" Christopher Heath Wellman's appeal to freedom of association (69). On Wellman's view, legitimate states possess a right to exclude prospective immigrants on the grounds that the right to political self-determination includes the right to freedom of association. Mendoza suggests that Wellman's position offers a possible solution to the liberty dilemma since it combines respect for political self-determination with a concern for moral and political equality and recognition of people's (limited) rights to freedom of association and movement (70-78). Mendoza also works through the many objections scholars have raised against Wellman's view and presents Wellman's responses to them, finding them sufficient to "salvage his overall view" (78-90).

In Chapter 5, Mendoza presents his own criticism of Wellman's view. Mendoza argues that there are moral limitations on the state's enforcement of its immigration policies and that these limitations imply that legitimate states do not have a presumptive right to exclude as Wellman claims (95). Mendoza first considers the coercive mechanisms states use to enforce their borders. Here, Mendoza focuses on the U.S. policy of prevention through deterrence. This policy, Mendoza claims, involves the concentration of personnel and resources at the largely accessible, urban parts along the U.S./Mexico border, leaving the less hospitable parts of the border to operate as natural barriers (97). As a consequence of this policy, Mendoza claims, between 2000 and 2014 nearly 6000 migrants died trying to cross the border (97). Mendoza argues that policies like prevention through deterrence fail to respect the individual liberty of prospective immigrants insofar as they are coercive and invasive (101). Legitimate states must therefore limit their use of coercive and invasive measures to morally acceptable levels. This implies, Mendoza argues, that legitimate states do not have a presumptive right to exclude prospective immigrants (105).

Mendoza argues second that there are also moral limits on the means states may use to enforce immigration policies internally -- i.e. to identify and deport undocumented immigrants. First, any policy the state adopts must meet the equality of burdens standard, according to which the "collateral effects that result from internal immigration enforcement be allocated as equally as possible among the citizenry" (108). Second, states must comply with the universal protections standard which requires that "all persons be reasonably protected from excessive internal immigration enforcement (110)." This standard, Mendoza argues, is necessary to ensure that all people's basic liberties are protected, and would require states to grant all persons "such basic protections as the right to due process, equal protection under the law, freedom from unreasonable searches and seizures, a right to a court appointed attorney, and protection from indefinite detention" (109-111). In particular, these two standards, Mendoza claims, would forbid states from employing many of the measures that the Trump administration is currently employing -- e.g. the use of local and state police officers to enforce immigration violations (111-112).

Mendoza's position on the moral limits to external and internal immigration enforcement amounts to what he calls the minimalist defense of immigrant rights. On this view, states must justify any restrictions on immigration, and with respect to internal enforcement, states must comply with the equality of burdens standard and the universal protections standard (113). Mendoza concludes his book by briefly spelling out the implications of his view for immigration reform in the U.S. (123-129).

Mendoza's minimalist defense of immigrant rights offers a novel contribution to the ethics of immigration literature, constituting a middle position between proponents of open borders and proponents of the right to exclude. Mendoza's focus on the ethics of immigration enforcement is also distinctive and urgent given the policies of the Trump administration. However, while Mendoza's position is promising, I do have some doubts about the argumentative strategy he employs to support it.

Mendoza's chief argument for his position is that "it offers the only consistent way out of both the security and liberty dilemmas" (113). Focusing on the liberty dilemma in particular, I see two problems with Mendoza's argumentative strategy. First, it's not always clear what the liberty dilemma is. Mendoza claims that the "kernel" of the liberty dilemma involves the conflict between Berlin's notions of positive and negative liberty where the former involves individual "self-determination" and the latter involves "individual freedom" (28-29). But, Mendoza also defines the dilemma as the conflict between individual freedom on the one hand, and "democratic self-determination" and "universal equality" on the other (32). Still later, Mendoza says the following regarding immigration and the liberty dilemma:

On one side of the debate, there is the communitarian-nationalist view that political communities ought to have the presumptive right to control their borders and access to citizenship. On this view, if a political community lacks the ability to do so it will not be self-determined and thereby runs the risk of disintegration. If a political community disintegrates, the consequences are disastrous, not the least of which would be an inability to promote distributive justice (i.e., universal equality) and sustain the conditions necessary for individuals to be self-realized (i.e., individual freedom). On the other side of the debate is the liberal cosmopolitan view that holds that anything short of (fairly) open-borders is a violation of an individual's right to freedom of movement (i.e., individual freedom) and/or fails to give all persons equal moral consideration (i.e., universal equality). (62)

Three things are worth noting. First, the concept of positive liberty -- i.e. self-determination -- is now the concept of a property of political communities rather than individuals. Second, the concept of "individual freedom" is no longer exclusively defined as negative liberty insofar as it involves individuals being "self-realized." Third, the dilemma seems to have become a trilemma, since universal equality is clearly considered here to be independent of democratic self-determination.

This lack of precision regarding the nature of the liberty dilemma makes it difficult to evaluate Mendoza's claim that only his account successfully escapes it. A second problem though is that it's not clear why the ability to resolve the liberty dilemma should be the standard by which we determine the success of a political theory. Any plausible political theory must of course incorporate the values of freedom and equality, but many political theorists, quite reasonably, clearly reject the idea that their task is to render consistent the concepts of positive and negative liberty. Libertarians and classical liberals, for example, don't see much value in positive liberty, instead constructing theories of justice grounded in conceptions of negative liberty (Mill 1978; Nozick 1974). Republican scholars construct theories of justice on the basis of a conception of liberty that is intended to offer an alternative to positive and negative conceptions of liberty -- e.g. liberty as non-domination (Pettit 1996). Although Mendoza takes Rawls to offer a theory of justice that best escapes the liberty dilemma in the domestic context, Rawls explicitly rejects the language of positive and negative liberty, opting for his own alternative conceptions of liberty, the worth of liberty, and the more basic idea of persons as free and equal (Rawls 1999, 176-180).

Mendoza's evaluative standard -- namely, the ability to resolve the liberty dilemma -- thus strikes me as a somewhat arbitrary standard by which to judge positions on the ethics of immigration. It would seem to disadvantage otherwise reasonable accounts that simply cannot be construed as aiming to render consistent the concepts of positive and negative liberty. For example, Mendoza rightly notes that libertarian and classical liberal theories of justice opt for the negative liberty horn of the liberty dilemma "at the expense of universal equality and democratic self-determination" (32). Does this mean that these views are fatally flawed -- i.e. because they do not aim to escape the liberty dilemma, instead opting for one horn rather than the other? This would seem to exclude from consideration some of the more powerful arguments for open borders which approach the immigration debate from this perspective and give little -- if any -- weight to the value of democratic self-determination as it pertains to decisions regarding exclusion and admission (see Huemer 2010).

A consequence of Mendoza's focus on resolving the liberty dilemma is that in defending his own position, he only really considers how it compares to Wellman's -- the position that provides "the best resolution to the liberty dilemma as it arises with respect to the issue of immigration" (95). Readers who reject Mendoza's evaluative standard may find this frustrating, wondering why Mendoza's position is more defensible than the views he summarizes in Chapter 3. For example, other than referring to the need to resolve the liberty dilemma, it's not clear why Mendoza rejects the open borders positions on offer. Similarly, readers may wonder why the considerations of freedom of association and cultural protection to which Wellman and David Miller appeal to justify a right to exclude aren't weighty enough to justify the use of coercion to exclude prospective immigrants.

In my view, therefore, one weakness of Mendoza's book is its overreliance on an evaluative standard that many scholars have good reasons to reject. Still, Mendoza's engagement with issues of immigration enforcement is a welcome contribution to the ethics of immigration literature. Mendoza's book should be of interest to scholars and policymakers concerned to reflect on the policies states may employ to enforce their immigration laws, and has important lessons for current U.S. enforcement policy.


Dickerson, Caitlin. 2017. "Immigration Arrests Rise Sharply as a Trump Mandate Is Carried Out." The New York Times, May 17. Accessed May 29, 2017.

Huemer, Michael. 2010. "Is There a Right to Immigrate?" Social Theory and Practice 36: 429-461.

Mill, J.S. 1978. On Liberty. ed. Elizabeth Rapaport, Hackett Publishing Company.

Nozick, Robert. 1974. Anarchy, State, and Utopia. Basic Books.

Pettit, Philip. 1997. Republicanism: A Theory of Freedom and Government. Oxford University Press.

Rawls, John. 1999. A Theory of Justice, rev ed. Harvard University Press.