The Moral Challenge of Dangerous Climate Change: Values, Poverty, and Policy

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Darrel Moellendorf, The Moral Challenge of Dangerous Climate Change: Values, Poverty, and Policy, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 263pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107678507.

Reviewed by Kendy M. Hess, College of the Holy Cross


Generally speaking, Darrel Moellendorf's book is a valuable, second-generation contribution to the literature on the normative implications of anthropogenic climate change. It brings together a great many issues that must be addressed in connection with climate change. Among others, it addresses the issues of normative principles and frameworks and of impacts to the non-human world, technical questions about risk and uncertainty and discounting future impacts, the distribution of mitigation costs, and the appropriateness of strategies other than mitigation. My brief summary does not (cannot) convey the sheer number of topics and concerns addressed, though Moellendorf's own summary (pp. 5-8) is excellent and will provide a slightly better sense. Each of these issues is enormously complex, and difficult enough to address in its own right. Most have been treated in some depth, but those treatments are generally scattered throughout a number of different literatures and often difficult to access and inter-relate. Such is always the case in the first generation of scholarship on a new issue. Moellendorf's book clearly belongs to the second generation, drawing out what consensus (or at least, convergence) we have managed to achieve and building on it: the book contributes to new, incremental progress on many of the underlying debates, and also begins the laborious process of bringing them all together and synthesizing the positions that have begun to emerge. Moellendorf accomplishes this to some extent simply by uniting so many disparate topics and addressing them in a single work and a single voice. More significantly, he does a lot of work to support the claim that two completely separate literatures -- the literatures on climate change and global poverty -- are in fact inextricably linked, and can no longer proceed independently. All of this is very helpful.

At the same time, Moellendorf's is not third generation scholarship.  His book doesn't achieve that decades-in-the-making clarity of claim, justification, implication, and conclusion that is typical of a fully developed literature. Much of the discussion is still extremely technical, dependent on specific frameworks and intuitions that may not be widely shared, and the chapters do not come to clear and compelling conclusions on the broader points addressed. As a result, while the text certainly builds toward a coherent thesis, it doesn't quite get there, and the conclusions it purports to reach are not always entirely justified. Moreover, while Moellendorf suggests that he is writing for a somewhat broad audience -- the book is "an attempt to talk about something of profound public importance, and to do so to an audience that is broader than only academic philosophers" (5) -- I doubt that many outside of the academy will be interested in working through the technical language and distinctly philosophical concerns. It is nonetheless a helpful addition to both the global poverty and climate change literatures, and an important resource for academics working in those areas.

The bulk of Chapter 1 (and Appendices A and B) are devoted to introducing and developing the Anti-Poverty Principle (APP), and saying a few words about the normative commitments underlying it. The underlying commitments are generally Kantian, driven by the importance of human dignity and justified by "reasons that can be shared by others . . . that abstract from the desires and concerns that are relevant only to an individual's own life" (21). The APP is the claim that

Policies and institutions should not impose any costs of climate change or climate change policy (such as mitigation and adaptation) on the global poor, of the present or future generations, when those costs make the prospects for poverty eradication worse than they would be absent them, if there are alternative policies that would prevent the poor from assuming those costs. (22)

The entire edifice of the book as a whole hangs on this one very small pin. It is not enough to recognize that this obligation is plausible, or appealing (which it is). The argument will require the reader to recognize this obligation as primary, overriding other moral concerns; Moellendorf acknowledges as much when he notes that his "account can be seen as taking poverty eradication as having a presumptive, extraordinarily high value" (26). I discuss this point later.

In Chapter 2 Moellendorf presents an anthropocentric argument for the preservation of species, and Chapter 3 moves on to a helpful explanation of the distinction between "risk" ("the product of the disvalue of a bad outcome and the probability of its occurrence") and "uncertainty," where it is impossible to calculate risk because the situation is "in a high degree unique" and it is thus impossible to assign probabilities with any degree of assurance (63-65). The middle section presents a good argument that political policy should assume a 3oC rise in global temperature (76-80; somewhat oddly, this number disappears from later discussions, which generally revolve around a 2oC rise). The remainder of the chapter introduces "minimax" (81-89), which is

a rule of thumb for rational choice under certain kinds of uncertainty on the assumption that an agent is seeking to minimize her loss. The rule holds that between courses of action -- all with uncertain negative outcomes -- the agent should compare only the highest loss scenarios of the courses and choose the course of action that causes the lowest of the highest loss scenarios to come to pass. (81)

In the midst of the discussion of minimax, Moellendorf introduces the idea of the "psychological fallacy," which makes a number of later appearances; we commit the psychological fallacy when "we [take] the psychological dispositions of individuals, vis-à-vis their own well-being, as models of the kinds of reasons appropriate for public policy that affects other people" (87).

Chapter 4 (with Appendix C) provides a helpful -- if quite technical -- discussion of the various practices and pitfalls involved in discounting future costs and benefits. This was a particularly useful and distinctive thing to encounter in a book on climate change. This chapter also introduces the idea of a "morally constrained CO2 budget" (121-22), which becomes important in Chapter 6.

In Chapter 5, Moellendorf argues at length that developing and less-developed countries have a right to sustainable development (defined at 124) grounded primarily in the existing Conventions. At the most basic level, they have this right because the signatories promised it to them (138-40). Further, he argues that the "development" guaranteed by this right goes beyond meeting basic needs (as described in the Brundtland Report) to the right to pursue and achieve levels of human development characterized as "high" by UNDP criteria (132-36).

The suggestion that "we" (the developed states) ought to do something about climate change is often met with the objection that "we" didn't do it -- that we (of the present generation) did not cause the problem and thus have no particular obligation to address it. In Chapter 6, Moellendorf argues that this objection mischaracterizes the basis for the obligation. First, the responsibility arises not from past misdeeds (or even past deeds) but from the fact that failure to mitigate now would itself constitute a moral violation, as it would involve taking more than our share of the remaining "morally constrained CO2 budget" (158-61). This is a particularly nice move. Second, Moellendorf argues at some length that this budget should be allocated on the basis of need, or conversely, that that the burdens should be allocated on the basis of "ability to pay" -- in part because alternative bases for distribution (polluter pays, strict liability, beneficiary responsibility) are unsatisfactory (165-73), and in part because it accounts for the right of less developed and developing states to continue emitting, which is implicit in his "right to sustainable development," as presented in Chapter 5 (173-76).

Finally, Chapter 7 addresses the appropriateness of responses other than mitigation. Moellendorf encourages proactive adaptation, but notes that

The result of warming significantly beyond 2oC could be that large areas of the Earth are no longer habitable by humans. This is a reason to believe that, if warming increases significantly beyond 2oC, increased investment into adaptation will be of little help to a great many people. (189)

Assisted migration may be appropriate in certain situations (190-91), while research into geo-engineering -- solar radiation management, carbon sequestration, etc. -- might be wise (191-202) despite concerns about moral hazard (184-85). The chapter concludes by listing four conditions for any "morally satisfactory international mitigation agreement" and three additional conditions for a "morally satisfactory domestic policy" (202-08).

I should begin my comments with three disclaimers: First, I am sympathetic to the general thrust of the majority of Moellendorf's claims, and thus somewhat less skeptical than other readers might be. Second, on the other side, the treatment here is explicitly and unapologetically anthropocentric. Moellendorf is clear that his goal is to come up with arguments and solutions that work in a practical context, and that presumably includes the ability to "sell" his conclusions in a political setting; there is no doubt that anthropocentrism is a popular position, and far more marketable in that sense than the alternatives. I nonetheless found the bald anthropocentrism profoundly jarring from start to finish. Third, Moellendorf relies on a kind of Kantian-Rawlsian-Habermasian framework (mostly implicit) that I personally find problematic, though I recognize it as a popular and well-established position. For these reasons, readers more adamantly opposed to climate mitigation will likely find the book less satisfying than I did, while readers more comfortable with anthropocentrism and the identified framework will find the book far more satisfying than I did.

Within that context, I would like to contribute three specific concerns to future discussion.

(1) The Anti-Poverty Principle. As mentioned above, the APP is central to the overall argument of the book, appearing repeatedly to undergird various claims. Moellendorf presents the APP in some detail in Chapter 1, and defends it (quite successfully) against rather abstract philosophical objections in Appendices A and B, but I have two concerns about it.

First and most importantly, the initial justification for the claim seems weak. Again, Moellendorf is working within a Kantian-Rawlsian-Habermasian framework, in which the force of justification depends on what people "have reason to" do, want, avoid, prefer, etc. It's a way of avoiding metaphysically awkward claims about what has value. As far as I can tell, the sole positive justification for the APP is that "everyone has a reason to avoid poverty." More specifically:

Everyone has a reason to avoid involuntary poverty. So, if the costs of risk reduction must be borne, it would be unreasonable for the poor to bear them insofar as this perpetuates their poverty. The risks of an energy policy should neither increase overall poverty nor delay eradicating it. Because it is not possible for everyone to avoid the costs of climate change, a principle that assigns the costs to the nonpoor is the most reasonable. (22)

The difficulty is that everyone "has a reason to avoid" lots of different things, not least of which is shouldering the overwhelming burden of paying for the health and well-being of millions (billions?) of total strangers. Another thing everyone "has a reason" to avoid is being prevented from giving preference -- even strong preference -- to their own friends, family, and projects. Rawls' maximin might stand as something of a bar to that, but even maximin doesn't completely defeat the human desire to "put one's own" first to some extent; it's something everyone "has reason to do." This framework allows for supererogatory acts and principles, and there's little here to suggest that the APP couldn't be one. My point here isn't that Moellendorf hasn't provided any justification for his APP, because he has; my concern is that he hasn't provided any reason to treat it as overriding -- as trumping other equally powerful "reasons," or even as being especially significant. As the sole driver for an international redistributive scheme that (1) allows continued GHG emissions from some states while barring others, and (2) demands actual transfers of money and technology, this needs a considerably stronger justification.

Second, Moellendorf makes periodic reference to the "tremendous suffering" associated with extreme poverty and climate change, and rightly so. It is precisely our sense of the hardships and misery associated with these things that gives the APP what force and plausibility it has. However, as noted above, in Chapter 5 Moellendorf explicitly rejects the Brundtland Report's focus on sustainable development as aimed at meeting basic needs, and argues instead for sustainable development as aimed at economic growth and "higher" human development. I'm not sure this rises to the level of actual equivocation or fallacy, but it is at best a little misleading to rely on the horrors of extreme poverty -- in which basic needs are not being met -- to reject programs that aim to meet precisely, if only, those basic needs in favor of programs that extend far beyond that.

(2) The Psychological Fallacy. As noted above, the psychological fallacy appears a number of times (see index listing). To draw on other presentations than the one given above, it "occurs when one uses psychological dispositions, such as being risk averse, as models for the kinds of reasons appropriate for the justification of public policy" (6). Again: "Appreciation of the psychological fallacy steers us clear of thinking that what we owe other persons is decided by our preferences -- how much we, in fact, discount future costs" (94-95). The idea seems to be that we shouldn't let people's personal preferences shape public policy, which is driven by other-regarding (moral) concerns unrelated to people's preferences. Fair enough. At the same time, it seems awkward -- to say the least -- that an argument justified exclusively in terms of what people "have reason to" want/value/pursue/avoid/etc. should be so utterly dismissive of what people actually do want/value/pursue/avoid/etc.

(3) Minimax. I would have liked a clearer statement about the triggering conditions for minimax. Rawls is clear that maximin comes into play when the outcomes are uncertain, the stakes are high, and the choice unrepeatable; we can then look at the original position, see that this is the case, and move to apply maximin. Here, however, the account seems circular. Again, Moellendorf describes minimax as "a rule of thumb for rational choice under certain kinds of uncertainty on the assumption that an agent is seeking to minimize her loss" (81). As far as when minimax (rather than utility maximization, maximin, or some other rule), should be used, he says

two conditions stand out: 1) An agent must have very good reasons to avoid the lowest net payout from among the available courses of action, and 2) in comparison to the reasons for avoiding the lowest net payout, the reasons for increasing the payout above the lowest are not nearly as compelling. . . . In any circumstance of uncertainty, a plausible case for the minimax approach would seem to require a third condition: 3) In order to be taken seriously as a real -- even if epistemically uncertain -- possibility, there must be a plausible explanation of its occurrence. (83)

The third condition is entirely plausible in any setting, of course; there's rarely much need to worry about outcomes that we have no plausible reason to expect. The first two conditions are less helpful, and essentially just restate the principle in terms of the preferred outcome: if you have good reason to avoid big losses and less reason to pursue gains, then you should use maximin . . . which tells you to minimize losses and sacrifice gains. This is circular, and does nothing to explain why the uncertainties of climate change, in particular, call for minimax reasoning. More robust guidance would be helpful, and would make the entire argument more compelling.