The Moral Foundations of Social Institutions

Placeholder book cover

Seumas Miller, The Moral Foundations of Social Institutions, Cambridge UP, 2010, 371pp., $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521744393.

Reviewed by Alexa Forrester, Franklin & Marshall College



After the tumult of the last decade — a preemptive war in Iraq, a large-scale humanitarian crisis in Darfur, the global collapse of financial markets, and heated political tensions within individual countries like Iran, Thailand and the United States - Seumas Miller’s The Moral Foundations of Social Institutions: A Philosophical Study (MFSI) offers a timely and thorough response to the question: what should our social institutions be and do?

Taken as a whole, Miller’s comprehensive normative theory of social institutions is undeniably valuable, both in its readiness to be marshaled to diagnose and improve our current institutions, and its ability to forward contemporary debates in applied social philosophy. It makes a weighty contribution to ongoing inquiry into how participation in complex social systems influences the nature and content of our individual moral obligations. But it does this without overstating the ontology of these systems. Miller acknowledges that the meaning and consequences of our actions cannot be understood without understanding the particular collectives within which those actions are authored. Nevertheless, according to him, the reins of agency still and always lie in the hands of individuals.

The book is divided into two sections. In the first half, Miller lays out his general theory; in the second half, he uses this theory to evaluate, and where appropriate, criticize contemporary institutions, including the media, universities, financial corporations, and the government as a meta-institution.

The theoretical half of MFSI draws on Miller’s previously published work in the areas of collective action theory and moral responsibility. He calls his theory a teleological, individualist, normative theory of social institutions. It is ‘teleological’ in the sense that it takes social institutions to be demarcated and partially defined in terms of the collective ends they serve. It is ‘individualist’ in the sense that it rejects the notion that institutions are collective agents, insisting instead that institutions are nothing over and above individuals and the relationships between those individuals. Defending this claim, Miller attends to how moral agents can individually hold ends in such a way that they thereby hold, jointly, a collective end, and how institutional roles and mechanisms bind groups of individuals into institutions. Where appropriate, he offers convincing responses to those who defend varieties of collectivism. Finally, Miller’s theory is a ‘normative’ theory of social institutions because, he contends, the collective ends that delineate various social institutions ought to be collective goods (or to serve collective goods).

Taking a normative stance that is refreshingly pluralistic, Miller maintains that these collective goods are multiple, and cannot be captured by a single monistic theory of value. He explores the plural moral foundations of institutions in Chapter 2, which include aggregated needs-based rights and joint moral rights, e.g., to life and to autonomy. He also highlights how social institutions have a normative dimension comprised of rights and duties that arise only subsequent to institutions. In Chapters 3, 4 and 5, he investigates the concepts of individual autonomy, collective responsibility, and corruption in light of his account. While these sections of the book demonstrate the impressive reach of Miller’s theory and further clarify the stakes of his view, not all of the arguments are conclusive.

Chapter 4 attempts to explicate the relationship between institutional and individual moral obligation and responsibility. To this end, part of the chapter is devoted to recapitulating and extending a prior debate with David Copp. On Copp’s collectivist conception of moral responsibility, an institution can have a given obligation or responsibility even if not one of the institution’s constituent members has the same obligation or responsibility. In a 2007 paper, Copp uses a series of cases to illustrate the possibility of such collective institutional responsibility.1 Miller examines each of these cases in turn and, drawing on the resources developed in previous chapters, finds flaws in each (pp. 142-153). But not all of these cases come out clearly in Miller’s favor.

For example, Miller examines Copp’s case of a prime minister (PM) who has to decide whether to release a political prisoner in order to save his own life. Copp takes this to be a case in which the government cannot be excused from its moral obligation to refrain from releasing the prisoner, but the PM can be excused from his moral obligation to refrain from releasing the prisoner. Miller agrees with this, but argues that this case does not actually support Copp’s thesis. He claims that even if the PM is rightly excused for releasing the prisoner, "qua PM, [he] has … precisely the same all things considered moral obligation [as the government] … not to release the prisoner" (p. 146).

I find this argument puzzling because it appears to hinge on applying the concept of an all things considered (ATC) moral obligation to an agentqua-institutional-role. Of course moral obligations can attach to an individual-qua-role. But can ATC moral obligations attach to individuals-qua-role? Additionally, and this worry applies to Miller and Copp equally, the claim that the PM is rightly excused from blame for failing to fulfill his ATC obligations is unstable. Failure to fulfill particular obligations can certainly be excused in light of ATC obligations, but in light of what are failures to fulfill ATC obligations supposedly excused?

In this case, Copp and Miller appear to believe that the PM’s fear for his life is a justifying excuse. Importantly, the PM’s fear (not the ATC weight of the PM’s life) is doing the justificatory work here. But if we excuse the PM because he was overcome with fear, we are excusing him because at that moment his capacity for rational agency (understandably) failed him. But then we must ask, in what sense does someone with a compromised capacity for rational agency have obligations? Also, can a government, like an individual, be overcome with fear? If so, will the government similarly be temporarily excused from its obligations? Answering these questions is tricky. But because the moral obligations of institutions and their component individuals are precisely the issue here, one wishes for more clarity in these matters.

In Chapter 5, Miller’s conceptual analysis of institutional corruption breaks new and promising ground. In an effort to demarcate institutional corruption adequately from a more general class of immoral actions, he entertains five intuitive hypotheses regarding the nature of institutional corruption, concluding that only three are true. From this investigation, he builds an account of the necessary and sufficient conditions for institutional corruption. This discussion both clarifies his teleological, individualist account of social institutions and sets him up for later applied discussions. The resulting analysis has much to recommend it.

However, here again the arguments are not entirely conclusive. For instance, Miller considers the case of a citizen who breaks into a local election office and falsifies the electoral role to assist his favored candidate (p. 169). Miller judges this to be a case of corruption and treats it as a counterexample to Dennis Thompson’s claim that political corruption necessarily involves an abuse of public office.2 But readers may not share Miller’s intuition that this case involves corruption, not even after Miller has reminded the reader that citizens hold institutional roles qua citizens. I am inclined to deny that this case involves corruption precisely because corruption usually (or perhaps necessarily) involves an abuse of institutionally granted privilege, though not necessarily an abuse of office. In fact, Miller’s account of corruption may be incomplete precisely for failing to include abuse of privilege as a condition on corruption. More cases and critical reflection are needed to settle the matter. Miller’s forthcoming work on institutional corruption might help on this front.

Because the first half of the book is occupied with intricate conceptual mapping and analysis, and because it is not always clear to what end these distinctions are being made, it is, at times, tedious to read. But the importance of this careful analysis is later vindicated when Miller puts it to work evaluating specific contemporary social institutions. He considers in particular the professions (Chapter 6), welfare institutions (Chapter 7), universities (Chapter 8), the police (Chapter 9), business corporations including media corporations and financial corporations (Chapter 10), information and communications organizations (Chapter 11), and the government (Chapter 12). Miller has crafted these chapters so that they will have stand-alone value to anyone interested in the particular institutions in question. I believe two of these discussions are particularly important for audiences beyond philosophers.

Chapter 8 addresses the troubling ways in which economic and political pressures are currently reshaping universities. By offering a lucid vision of the purposes of the university, Miller pinpoints exactly why these changes are troubling. Drawing on both Mill’s conception of free inquiry as a necessary means to knowledge and Kant’s conception of free inquiry as a fundamental moral right, he maintains that the proper purpose of the university is twofold: to institutionalize the pursuit of knowledge and to embody the right to free intellectual inquiry (p. 236). From here, he argues that certain rights, most notably the autonomy of scholars, are necessary — though not sufficient — conditions for the fulfillment of these institutional ends, thereby explaining the precise wrong that occurs when they are compromised in the name of profitability or overburdened by bureaucracy.

Beyond defending the rights associated with the role of scholar, Miller also insists it is attended by vital duties. For instance, scholars have a duty to keep abreast of work being done in their fields. And scholars who have lost the capacities required to engage in rigorous free inquiry are morally obligated to resign from their positions. Though Miller never explicitly addresses the widespread phenomenon of grade inflation and the burgeoning of “grade 13”3 issues now plaguing institutions of higher education, his articulation of the duty to transmit intellectual skills can be used to rebuke professors and administrators who contribute to these trends. In general, all those involved in higher education will benefit from Miller’s critical reflection on the university as a social institution.

In Chapter 10, Miller turns his attention toward modern media corporations. Working from the premise that the collective end of media organizations (whether private or public) is public communication in the service of the public interest, Miller argues effectively that contemporary media outlets, which primarily “provide entertainment and make profits for corporations” (p. 283), are falling short of their moral duties.

In the same chapter, which is devoted generally to business corporations, Miller also attempts to diagnose the shortcomings of, and potential remedies for, the financial services sector. Miller lays out the particular challenges involved in clarifying the collective ends of business corporations and then proceeds to argue that the pursuit of profit is properly treated only as a proximate end that serves, directly or indirectly, collective goods. He writes, “To claim that the ultimate purpose of the institution of the modern corporation … is simply and only to maximize profits [is to] confuse proximate with ultimate purposes” (p. 292).

Miller’s instrumentalist view of corporations and markets sets him against those who reject the idea that markets should be regulated or otherwise engineered in the name of collective goods. He calls these opponents “market fundamentalists.”4 Because market fundamentalism in various forms and degrees is popular, it is worth mentioning how Miller’s arguments both succeed and fail against this view. To start, we must note that there are two distinct types of market fundamentalists against whom Miller might be arguing, which he himself does not clearly distinguish — namely, (1) those who support free markets because they believe that the ‘invisible hand’ of the free market is more efficient than engineered markets at delivering collective goods, and (2) those who support free markets because they believe that free markets are morally superior to engineered markets regardless of whether they are more efficient at delivering collective goods. Miller effectively dismisses type-1 fundamentalism early his book, noting that it is simply an empirical fact whether and under which circumstances free markets deliver collective goods, and insisting that “the much vaunted invisible hand of markets be made to deliver on its promises, including by way of appropriate incentive structures that are regulated into existence” (p. 63).

But this does not answer the second form of market fundamentalism, and here, Miller’s claim that market fundamentalists ‘confuse’ proximate with ultimate ends undersells his opponent. For the type-2 fundamentalist, maximizing profit is the most just aim for corporations (respecting the bounds of moral obligation) precisely because it allows individuals within those institutions to decide whether and how their labor contributes to collective goods. This is important because contributing to collective goods is, in many cases, only morally supererogatory, rather than obligatory. Forcing people to labor toward supererogatory ends is unjust. So, for type-2 fundamentalists, if the invisible hand fails to provide these supererogatory collective goods, this is an unfortunate side effect of justice, not a reason to abandon the system.

There are undoubtedly confusions within this type of fundamentalism, and one wishes Miller had leveraged his many resources to effectively expose those confusions. But he has not. Further, it is important for those who wish to combat market fundamentalism to recognize that type-2 fundamentalism does not simply confuse proximate ends (profit) with ultimate ends (collective goods). Rather type-2 fundamentalists know that their opponents want to ‘channel’ their profit-making activities toward collective goods, but maintain that profit maximization makes a more just ultimate end for corporations than any particular prescribed collective good(s). Thus, to answer these fundamentalists, Miller needs an argument that attacks that value claim directly.5

Nevertheless, Miller’s discussion of the financial services sector offers a valuable insight — namely, that the lack of a coherent and guiding institutional purpose is itself a source of destabilization in the corporate world. Because his own competing vision of markets — in which they play a vital instrumental role in providing key collective goods — is intuitively attractive, it essentially leaves the ball in the fundamentalist’s court.

In fact, this last point can be generalized to Miller’s theory as a whole. With this book, he implores us to consider how much better things could be if we all — and in particular, if people in key institutional roles of power — stopped to attend to the purposes of our institutions and the choices we make within them. The mere possibility of social institutions as Miller envisions them changes the normative landscape. In this sense, the book not only offers a powerful general theory and great deal of fodder for contemporary philosophical debates, it also serves as a model for how careful philosophical inquiry allows us to better understand who we can and should be.

1 David Copp. 2007. “The Collective Moral Autonomy Thesis”. Journal of Social Philosophy 38, no. 3: 369-388.

2 Dennis Thompson. 1995. Ethics in Congress: From Individual to Institutional Corruption. Washington D.C.: Brookings Institute. (p. 25)

3 David M. Perry and Kathleen E. Kennedy. December 13, 2009. “Teaching ‘Grade 13’”. The Chronicle of Higher Education. On-line at

4 Miller attributes this term to George Soros, for example in George Soros. 2008. The New Paradigm for Financial Markets: The Credit Crisis of 2008 and What It Means. New York: Perseus Books.

5 It is worth noting that Miller does, at an earlier point in the book, offer one such argument (pp. 61-63). But this argument hinges on intuitions that type-2 fundamentalists might reasonably reject.